Futurity in Phenomenology: Promise and Method in Husserl, Levinas and Derrida

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Neal DeRoo, Futurity in Phenomenology: Promise and Method in Husserl, Levinas and Derrida, Fordham University Press, 2013, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823244645.

Reviewed by Jack Reynolds, La Trobe University


In recent times there has been a spate of books in the broadly speaking continental tradition on time and method -- e.g., Leonard Lawlor's Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophy, David Hoy's The Time of Our Lives, John McCumber's Time and Philosophy, and my own Chronopathologies, to name but a few. In Futurity in Phenomenology, Neal DeRoo adds his voice to this field and complements these other texts by focusing in more detail upon phenomenology and the future (another important text on related themes is Michael Kelly's forthcoming Phenomenology and the Problem of Time, Palgrave-MacMillan 2014). These books tend to be about the continental tradition in general, or even about the continental tradition and its putative others. DeRoo, however, examines the three thinkers of the subtitle -- Husserl, Levinas and Derrida. This is both a strength and a weakness, in comparison to these other efforts to understand the centrality of time to Post-Kantian continental philosophy and the way in which it intimately involves methodological decisions concerning how philosophy ought to best be done.

To start with the strengths, it is certainly the case that DeRoo's detailed examination of Husserl, Levinas and Derrida explores their work on time (especially the future) and method in more depth than any of these other books do. To put his argument bluntly, phenomenology is revealed as essentially a promissory discipline, as always-already oriented to and constituted by the future, rather than obsessed with the living-present to the exclusion of the genuinely futural, as the standard stereotypical reception of phenomenology from some quarters suggests. DeRoo offers sophisticated phenomenological analyses of different relations to the future in expecting, anticipating, waiting, promising, etc., that are of philosophical importance in their own right, and add to Husserl's, Levinas', and Derrida's own phenomenological labours. While the focus may seem to be somewhat narrow, this concern with the future also helps to shed new light on issues like the connection between phenomenology and ethics. That said, the postulated connection between futurity and openness to the other (and hence ethics) does not give as much attention to what Levinas and Derrida call the "immemorial past" (but cf. 80) as one might expect, given its importance to their respective philosophies of time, especially as concerns how they relate to ethics. Without the past that perdures, but is nonetheless not representable, openness to the other/futurity seems unable to capture some of the key temporal dimensions of ethically significant activities - forgiveness, for example, is temporally tensed, extended, and dependent on the past (see Kelly 2014).

In general though, DeRoo's re-presentation of this tradition is quite compelling, offering an important corrective to some of the views about Husserl that predominate, and managing to make sense of both Levinas' and Derrida's claims to find resources for their particular renewals of phenomenology from within Husserl's own oeuvre. While many philosophers have taken Derrida's early engagement with Husserl to signal the end of phenomenology, for example, DeRoo offers a persuasive corrective to any such too quick conclusion, reading Derrida's early and late writings in a manner that is shown to develop from some indications within Husserl's own work. Nor does DeRoo offer mere scholarly exegesis. As already noted, he offers his own phenomenological analyses. Moreover, on that and other bases he also criticizes dimensions of the work of all of the three philosophers under consideration, albeit often in the name of another spirit that undergirds their work.

One example of this is his attempt to argue that the messianic is an "umbrella term" that encompasses both what Derrida refers to as messianicity and messianisms, while he also concedes that Derrida himself sometimes conflates this alleged messianic/messianicity distinction (121). He also distances Derrida's writings on the messianic from Kantian interpretations of this dimension of his work, suggesting instead that it is the result of an epoche (122). While this looks plausible, it would have been more convincing if combined with a more thorough discussion of transcendental reasoning as a method, including consideration of Derrida's own conception of the "quasi-transcendental" and how this relates to, and differs from, Husserl and Kant on the transcendental. It is also surprising that DeRoo's book gives no attention at all to one of Derrida's most sustained engagements with phenomenology -- that found in On Touching. This text of Derrida's includes long chapters on Husserl, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas, as well as some of the thinkers of the "theological turn in phenomenology" that interest DeRoo. One wonders if there is something in this text that troubles DeRoo's argument. Time is certainly central to the concerns Derrida's raises here about phenomenology, which he situates here within a longer tradition of French intuitionism/haptocentrism.

DeRoo's narrower focus on these three phenomenological philosophers has some potential "external" weaknesses associated with it, especially insofar as he wants to show the value of the method of phenomenology (now shown to have always-already been committed to the future) and to affirm why one ought to think and reflect phenomenologically. DeRoo does indeed usefully deploy the methods of phenomenology, but meta-reflections on those methods are not in abundance and because of this his arguments are not as convincing as they might be, largely because he does not consider potential contrasts with other treatments of time and method. DeRoo lays his bets on a normative claim for the value of phenomenological philosophy, but despite his precise attentiveness to tensions within this project, the inquiry nonetheless begs the question of the value of this approach (notwithstanding the situating of Derrida as in some sense within the phenomenological tradition).

Of course, none of us can adopt a metaphilosophical view from nowhere, and there is a risk that ostensibly neutral comparisons of differing philosophies will end up embracing a rather abstract and sterile metaphilosophy that is no longer itself properly philosophical[1]. That is not quite what I am advocating, though, and the relationship between metaphilosophy and philosophy is better conceived of as a both/and, rather than an either/or. Indeed, one can attempt to be philosophically neutral in doing metaphilosophy, but it cannot entirely succeed. Likewise, one can attempt to just do philosophy without metaphilosophy, other than that provided by a pre-existing tradition, but that threatens to be doxa or a form of chauvinism that uncritically harbors a variety of presuppositions. This aporetic and aleatory dimension to philosophy is not something that can be resolved, but must be negotiated and endured in the activity. Without digressing further, my point is that there is not a lot of metaphilosophy in DeRoo's book from anything other than an "internal" perspective, and yet the normative force of the claim that one should do phenomenology cannot solely derive from phenomenological considerations alone. I may have an idiosyncratic understanding of phenomenology, but in my view it is never complete, and able to be discharged entirely in accord with the principle of all principles. It always also involves inferential and non-phenomenological moments too. In this respect, I think I have Derrida and (perhaps) DeRoo in support (cf. fn 53, 190), but DeRoo does not himself deploy this insight in the text in question.

For example, in an interesting characterisation of his book, DeRoo says that because he hopes to

show that a focus on futurity can help us to find (not just historically but also philosophically) significant common ground between the various strands of phenomenology, common ground that can help us to reevaluate phenomenology as a whole and each strand individually, my focus must be first and foremost on the methodological significance of futurity for phenomenology (3).

In regard to this stated aim, he clearly succeeds in an internalist sense. He does make a case for common ground within the thought of the phenomenologists considered, and there is something revealed via this "internal" view that any attempt to take an "external" view will miss (for example, an interconnection between the various phenomenological analyses undertaken and how they relate to each other, an understanding of the genetic debts that both Levinas and Derrida owe to Husserl, etc.). But is this sort of immanent look at methodological presuppositions sufficient? Perhaps not, since DeRoo sometimes offers methodological or metaphilosophical justifications that seem rather tenuous and under-developed. For example, he says: "if our tradition provides us with our norms (or validity systems), then we seem able to analyze our tradition only from within that tradition itself (i.e. according to the norms it itself provides. The only way to avoid this circularity is by giving in to it" (150). It is hard to see how giving in to a circularity is avoiding it, as is suggested here, and such a position is not justified in any sustained way.

This may seem like I am asking DeRoo to have written a different book -- something akin to the book I would have written, which is, of course, the trick of bad reviews everywhere. But I think the focus on method does invite these sort of questions. This is so even if we restrict our focus to phenomenology proper and the role of the future for it, bracketing any worries about whether this is the best or appropriate way to philosophise in general, or to philosophise about the future in particular. I am not entirely convinced by the claims that the Husserl, Levinas, and Derrida triumverate is significant enough to be privileged over other possible triumverates (and why not more than three?). It is hard to agree with DeRoo that this threesome is better for understanding the connection between the phenomenological method and futurity than any that include Heidegger, for example (4). Certainly Heidegger was an enormous influence upon both Levinas and Derrida, and perhaps even the later work of Husserl as well. And, betraying my own philosophical predilections, it is arguable that the phenomenological philosopher who best thematised the paradoxical nature of the reduction, of phenomenology as both constituting and constituted, was Merleau-Ponty, and who advocated the open-ended and necessarily incomplete nature of phenomenology in his famous "Preface" to Phenomenology of Perception.

The conclusion of DeRoo's book is also rather anti-climactic. He emphasises that phenomenology has an inherent tension within it that pulls in two different directions: intuitionism and concrete immediacy on the one hand, a focus on constituting consciousness and something close to transcendental idealism on the other. Now, to say that we must balance these dialectically is important, but as far as I can see it is not to say much about the future(s) of phenomenology at all. Indeed, the book concludes in somewhat vague terms: "By opening ourselves to the essential role of futurity in phenomenology, we have opened ourselves to new possibilities, new pursuits, for the present and future of phenomenology" (153). Maybe, but like what? Perhaps we should not anticipate or domesticate the future with prognostications of such kinds, which deprive the future of what is essential to it -- i.e., that it is unknown. But without some indications of this sort, I am not quite as sure as I would like to be as to exactly what has been accomplished in DeRoo's book, as scholarly and insightful as it undoubtedly is.


[1]I am borrowing from, and minimally responding to, some ideas in a recent talk by Burt Hopkins, which expressed some cogent worries about a book I co-authored with James Chase, Analytic versus Continental (delivered at SPEP 2012).