Fuzzy Logic and Mathematics: A Historical Perspective

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Radim Bělohlávek, Joseph W. Dauben, and George J. Klir, Fuzzy Logic and Mathematics: A Historical Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2017, 531pp., $99.00, ISBN 9780190200015.

Reviewed by Christian Fermüller, Technische Universität Wien


Fuzzy logic is a wide, some would even say a wild, topic. Some years ago, on a trip to Vietnam, I found the label "Fuzzy Logic" prominently attached to the water heater in my hotel room. I can't imagine that, say, an epistemologist or an expert in modal logic, for that matter, will ever encounter the name of her research field attached to basic equipment of daily life. I mention this only to emphasize that any book about fuzzy logic, addressed to a general audience, has to face a wide range expectations, possibly also preconceptions in view of the controversies that accompanied the topic since its initiation by Lotfi A. Zadeh in the 1960s. The title of this book might suggest to some that the authors seek to circumvent discussions about the mentioned controversies and about the wider usage of the term fuzzy logic by restricting attention to mathematical issues. But this is not at all the case. While the book certainly contains a very comprehensive and thoughtfully organized, up-to-date overview over almost all research areas connected to fuzzy logic that subscribe to a mathematical methodology, it also provides a highly informative and very balanced account of the debates and controversies that accompanied its history. Moreover, it traces the emergence of a wide range of application areas, and it documents the development and significance of the field by carefully reviewing relevant data, rather than by sketchy and selective personal impressions, as is so often the case in publications with a comparatively broad scope. Given the focus on mathematical concepts and on a sober and detailed documentation of all relevant developments, one might be forgiven for suspecting that the book must make for somewhat dull reading. Hence, it may come as a surprise that in fact it is not only invariably informative, but also a pleasure to read: central actors come to life and important events are reviewed in a vivid manner. Moreover, even technical material is presented in an accessible style.

Before reviewing the various sections, let me briefly comment on its emergence, its timeliness and its authors. As explained in the preface, the idea for writing this book came to the (alphabetically) third author, George J. Klir, during discussions at the Eighth World Congress of the International Fuzzy Systems Association (IFSA) in Taipei in August 1999, where the approaching new millennium fostered discussions about the past, present, and future of fuzzy logic. However, the task appeared to be too daunting to be taken up by a single author. When Klir, about a decade later, asked his former colleague Radim Bělohlávek to join in writing this book, two of the most prolific and best-informed researchers in the field had committed to this challenging task. The two wisely decided that the historical nature of the project called for also enlisting Joseph W. Dauben, a distinguished expert on the history of mathematics and logic. The quality of the resulting book justifies speaking of the trio as a dream team for this ambitious enterprise. Sadly, George Klir, who was not only a main contributor to fuzzy logic, but is also well known for his significant contributions to general systems theory and information theory, died in May 2016. The book recently received additional sad timeliness from the fact that Lofti A. Zadeh, the founder of fuzzy logic, died in September 2017. Moreover, Petr Hájek, the main driving force behind the contemporary approach to "fuzzy logic in the narrow sense", one of the central topics of this book, also died in December 2016.

After briefly explaining the aims and of scope of the book in chapter 1, chapter 2 is devoted to the "Prehistory, Emergence, and Evolution of Fuzzy Logic." Prehistory, here, mainly refers to many-valued logics, but also to other challenges of classical (bivalent) logic, starting in antiquity and culminating in a host of corresponding logical formalisms in the early twentieth century. Although comparatively brief, this section is not at all sketchy or too selective; rather, it can serve as a self-contained, necessarily selective introduction into the history of nonclassical logics. The rest of the chapter traces in considerable detail, supported by crucial quotations and careful attention to relevant events and publications, the emergence of fuzzy logic and its early developments, including its (in some respects) highly critical reception. Section 2.4 on documented debates is certainly of great interest not only to historians of science, but to everyone who wants to understand the surprisingly vehement and emotional attacks on Zadeh's early papers on fuzzy set theory. The authors make clear that this criticism was largely based on fundamental misunderstandings regarding the nature of the relevant formal concepts, in particular their relation to probability theory. For example, the flawed attempt to invoke Cox's so-called proof to show that probability is the only sound way of dealing with uncertainty formally, is presented with exemplary clarity. (This includes appendix A, "The Enigma of Cox's Proof.") Section 2.5 on the evolution of supporting infrastructure for fuzzy logic is a useful reminder on the importance of institutions like conference series, journals, and scientific associations in establishing and fostering a scientific discipline.

In the 1990s Zadeh introduced a useful distinction between "Fuzzy Logic in the Narrow Sense" and "Fuzzy Logic in the Broad Sense." Chapter 3 is devoted to the latter and consequently deals with many different facets of fuzzy set theory. A fuzzy set is a function mapping each element of a universal set (domain) into an element from the unit interval [0,1], i.e., into a real number greater or equal to 0 and smaller or equal to 1. The intended interpretation is that the number denotes the degree to which an element belongs to the given fuzzy set. Ordinary sets, called crisp sets in this context, appear as a special case, where the membership degree of each element is either 0 or 1. The authors carefully define, explain and motivate many directly related concepts, operations and generalizations of this central notion. They also cover topics like possibility theory, fuzzy clustering, and methods for constructing fuzzy sets. The latter refers to the challenge of deriving membership degrees in a systematic manner from given data and modeling principles. Also, the important issue of to what extent variations in the membership degrees of input fuzzy sets affect the output of a fuzzy system is addressed. Readers who want to dig into this topic more deeply are referred to the important and aptly titled paper "Do exact shapes of fuzzy sets matter?", for which Radim Bělohlávek received the 2007 Best Paper Award from the International Journal of General Systems. In the final section of the chapter, nonstandard fuzzy sets are briefly discussed. As the authors explain, they decided not to discuss various forms of nonstandard fuzzy sets in detail to keep the size of the book within reasonable limits. Nevertheless, some corresponding concepts are covered with interesting historical background information.

While all parts of the book are highly informative and well presented, I consider Chapter 4, "Fuzzy Logic in the Narrow Sense," a particular highlight. Even many practitioners of fuzzy logic in the broad sense are often not aware of important recent developments in the logical foundations of reasoning with graded propositions and predicates. The book under review might be instrumental in changing this situation. It is, of course, impossible to cover each relevant result in a single book. However, it is impressive to see how many quite different important results the authors manage to present in a single chapter. This is even more impressive in light of the fact that all topics are explained with considerable care and accompanied by a wealth of historical information about the corresponding line of research. To grasp all of the presented material, the reader needs to have a firm knowledge of formal logic that might have to go beyond what is usually covered in an introductory logic course in philosophy or computer science. Specialists will find it interesting to see how the authors select, organize and present relevant results. But even readers without a firm background in mathematical logic will be able to take away a fair understanding of central developments and facts in this relatively new area, also known as Mathematical Fuzzy Logic.

I want to pick out just two of the many topics covered in Chapter 4: Hájek's program and fuzzy logic and uncertainty. Petr Hájek's Metamathematics of Fuzzy Logic (1998) not only summarized a host of important results that Hájek had established in the 1990s, but, most importantly, presented a new perspective on fuzzy logic. Until rather recently, many, if not most, mathematical logicians thought of many-valued logics in general, and fuzzy logic in particular, as an area that might have relevance for engineering applications, but that largely consists in straightforward, but often unsystematic generalizations of classical concepts to a many-valued setting. Indeed, there was a time when ambitious logicians or computer scientists, in conversation with colleagues working on notoriously hard problems in, say, complexity theory or the semantics of programming languages, would rather avoid mentioning, out of fear of being classified as a "shallow mathematician", the term "fuzzy logic" when explaining their own current research, even when the corresponding result or problem was clearly related to the field that Zadeh had initiated. It took an eminent and highly respected logician like Petr Hàjek to convince fellow logicians that one should look at fuzzy logic (in the narrow sense) as a subfield of contemporary logic which can be based on convincing, sound and sophisticated mathematical foundations, triggering a host of interesting research problems. In particular, Hàjek suggested identifying candidates of truth functions for conjunction with so-called continuous triangular norms (t-norms) and using the unique residuum that exists for every such t-norm as a truth function for implication. Truth functions for other logical connectives can be added in a systematic fashion. Some important logics, like the infinite-valued logics of Lukasiewicz and of Gödel/Dummett emerge as special cases. Moreover, there is a unique logic of arbitrary continuous t-norms, nowadays called Hajek's Basic Logic. The indicated insights were just the starting point for a very rich theory, which still occupies the minds of many contemporary logicians.

The other section of Chapter 4 that I want to single out as particularly important is entitled "Fuzzy logic and uncertainty." It starts by distinguishing vagueness from uncertainty, declaring that "Peter is tall" is vague but not uncertain, while "Peter comes tomorrow" is not vague but uncertain. At this point some readers might be tempted to protest, since one often uses the words "vague" and "uncertain" in a different way. The protest may even amplify when the authors continue with the following statement: "We may assign 0.7 or other degrees to both sentences but in the first case, we do so to account for the vagueness of the concept tall while in the second to account for our uncertainty about Peter's actual appearance tomorrow" (p. 210). This distinction between the two types of degrees is important, since the first type, degrees of truth, is stipulated to behave truth functionally, while degrees of the second type, degrees of belief, cannot in general be combined functionally: we cannot compute the degree of belief of "Peter is coming tomorrow, but Mary is not coming tomorrow" if we only know the degrees of belief for the two component sentences. (In order to do so we additionally need to know to which degree Peter's appearance tomorrow is independent of Mary's non-appearance.) My main reason for emphasizing that one might disagree here is the fact that philosophers interested in the phenomenon of vagueness are certainly part of the intended audience. But most philosophers are skeptical, if not hostile regarding the adequateness of a degree theoretic, truth functional account of vagueness. (A pointer to Section 5.4.3, where this issue is taken up, would have been helpful. We will briefly comment on that section below.) In any case, the authors clarify that there are various types and models of uncertainty and correspondingly numerous logics of belief. After briefly mentioning various forms of probabilistic logics, some formalisms that are more directly relevant to fuzzy logic are described: possibilistic logic developed by Didier Dubois and Henri Prade, Giangiacomo Gerla's probabilistic fuzzy logics, and some extensions of fuzzy logics by modalities and quantifiers for modeling reasoning about (degrees of) belief.

Chapter 5 is entitled "Mathematics Based on Fuzzy Logic." In the hands of less able authors, presenting this topic could easily degenerate into a long list of definitions and theorems that result from replacing the underlying classical (bivalent) machinery by a many-valued one. Instead, something much more valuable and interesting is offered here. It is pointed out that the consideration of fuzzy logic as a basic ingredient for defining and reasoning about mathematical concepts triggers a versatile interplay between classical concepts and many-valued ones. While one may profitably reason classically about fuzzy structures, one may also generalize classical mathematical statements to statements that are not simply true or false, but can be assigned a possibly intermediate degree of truth. Moreover, the central role of fuzzy set theory leads to the problem of providing foundations of mathematics based on fuzzy logic. This is particularly important in view of the early criticism of fuzzy logic as lacking a solid mathematical foundation. The problem is not pushed aside here by simply pointing to formal versions of fuzzy type theory or fuzzy set theory, but is discussed in clear view of the various challenges and issues that arise on different levels for the generalization of the standard classical setting to a many-valued one. In Section 5.2.1, the seemingly simple example of transitivity of a relation is used to illustrate various aspects of "fuzzifying" a basic concept of classical mathematics. A method is explained that proceeds by fixing a suitable fuzzy logic in the narrow sense and then translating the informal classical meta-language of the original definition into this logic. It is not concealed that "fuzzification" of classical concepts is not unique in principle. Rather, this is discussed explicitly and illustrated for the example at hand. It is argued that nevertheless the outlined approach is methodologically sound, useful, and reasonable.

Chapter 5 also offers a nice overview of developments based on fuzzy logic in selected areas of mathematics, including algebra, topology, probability and geometry. Instead of commenting on all those sections explicitly, I rather want to draw attention to a particularly curious fact about many-valued set theory that might be of interest to anyone working on the foundation of mathematics. The standard "solution" to the well-known paradoxes of naive set theory, in particular to Russell's paradox about the set containing all sets that do not contain themselves, is to restrict the principle of comprehension, which says that for every property, there is a set containing precisely those objects that satisfy the property. Skolem, in 1957, observed that Russell's paradox disappears in the three-valued Lukasiewicz logic, since "x ∈ x if and only if not (x ∈ x)" is no longer a contradictory formula. This suggests that one might be able to formalize set theory using the axiom scheme of full comprehension without losing consistency, as long as a many-valued logic is used as base calculus. However, Skolem observed that variations of Russell's paradox still lead to inconsistency for any finitely-valued Lukasiewicz logic. Skolem thus turned to infinitely-valued Lukasiewicz logic and proved that full comprehension for properties expressed by quantifier-free formulas (like x ∈ x or its negation) can be consistently added to the other axioms of set theory for quantifiers, based on this logic. More expressive instances of the comprehension scheme were shown to be consistent in the indicated sense as well, by Chang and Fenstad in the 1960s. Eventually, White published a consistency proof for unrestricted full comprehension in 1979. However, in 2014 Kazushige Terui communicated a serious flaw in White's proof. The problem thus seemingly remains unsettled till today. All this sounds rather exciting, but it has to be asked whether one can really develop substantial parts of mathematics in the indicated version of set theory, called Cantor-Lukasiewicz set theory by Hàjek (2005). Unfortunately, the answer is negative: Hàjek showed that introducing natural numbers along with a simple scheme of induction in Cantor-Lukasiewicz set theory leads to contradiction.

The final Section 5.4 of the chapter deals with three related topics that will be of particular interest to philosophers. Regarding the first topic, interpretation of truth degrees, the authors review, among other relevant research, an interesting approach by Robin Giles, worked out in the 1970s and early 1980s in several papers. Giles's model of reasoning under vagueness is based on a dialogue game inspired by Lorenzen's "dialogical logic" and stipulates that, while one cannot consistently test the truth of a given vague atomic statement, one can talk in a systematic fashion about the expected risk involved in betting that an associated dispersive test, i.e. one that may show different results when repeated, will succeed. (I should disclose here that I have more recently used and extended Giles's game in various ways; one of the resulting papers, with George Metcalfe (2009), is cited in the book.)

The second topic, fuzzy logic and paradoxes, briefly presents various suggestions for resolving the sorites paradox, Poincaré's paradox about mathematizing the physical continuum, paradoxes of set theory, and the liar paradox. In laudable contrast to many pompous claims about "solving" paradoxes with fuzzy logic, the authors conclude by stating: "whether or not a paradox appears when approached in a formal setting with truth degrees is a delicate matter requiring careful examination. Clearly, no less care is needed for assessment of whether this or that formal result offers a plausible resolution of the paradox." (p. 339).

The third topic is fuzzy logic and vagueness. As already mentioned, I expect that some philosophers, in particular those who think that an adequate theory of vagueness should either not sacrifice the principle of bivalence at all, or at most admit the possibility of gaps or gluts of truth, rather than degrees of truth, may find points of disagreement here. However, taking into account the (adequately) limited space devoted to the topic, the authors manage to present a well informed and balanced account of all central issues. In particular, they avoid untenable claims about fuzzy logic as the best model of vagueness, all too often made by researchers and practitioners in the field. Rather they present a short discussion on defining vagueness, followed by a review of early contributions that contains interesting citations from Locke, Watts, Alexander Bain, and Frege, and a very brief, but fair and informative, overview of theories of vagueness discussed in contemporary philosophy. The final paragraphs, summarized under the title "Vagueness and fuzzy logic," contain useful pointers to recent discussions and relevant literature, most importantly Vagueness and Degrees of Truth (2008) by Nicholas J.J. Smith, where a sophisticated and convincingly argued theory of vagueness based on fuzzy logic is proposed.

Chapter 6 is devoted to "Applications of Fuzzy Logic." At the outset, the authors declare their ambitious goal of not only surveying relevant literature and developments in applications of fuzzy logic to a selected areas, "but also, more importantly, . . . assessing their usefulness in these respective areas." (p. 347) I suppose that only a large collective of experts in quite different fields of human affairs could adequately judge whether all relevant developments receive a complete and fair assessment. However, the broad range of presented applications is certainly impressive. Moreover, there is a wealth of historical information on each of the selected applications. Readers with an interest in engineering will be pleased to see "fuzzy controlling" explained in quite some detail, together with appropriate illustrations. Others might be glad to find interesting historical remarks and useful references on application areas, like decision making, physics, earth sciences, psychology, economics, medicine, and many more.

The seventh and final chapter aims at an appraisal of the "Significance of Fuzzy Logic," based on the historical analysis presented in the earlier chapters and on a "vision of prospective future developments in fuzzy logic" (p. 421). It is argued that fuzzy logic constitutes a new paradigm that emerged as a response to the neglect of the fundamental and pervasive phenomenon of vagueness of concepts. Rather than attempting to eliminate inexactness at the outset, fuzzy logic suggests respecting the purposeful employment of impression and provides a framework for computing with "precisiations" of vague words. It is emphasized that this does not result in a new kind of mathematics, but rather in traditional mathematics applied to precisely defined objects that represent imprecise concepts and notions. This qualitative assessment is accompanied by a quantitative one, documenting the impact of fuzzy logic using various bibliometric and related data. The authors close with their assessment of the future prospects of fuzzy logic. They offer thoughtful statements about the problem of raising awareness of fuzzy logic, connecting research to applications, interactions between fuzzy logic in the broad and in the narrow sense; and they note various foundational issues that have not yet been addressed exhaustively.

Let me point out that I have not been able to do full justice to the wealth of material covered in the book. I had to choose what parts to discuss explicitly and what to glance over. Naturally, this selection is mostly based on personal interest and subjective judgments. I can well imagine another reviewer, who would emphasize different aspects. This fact witnesses the astonishing richness of this impressive book. While I recommend reading all of it in sequence, I think that it can also profitably be used as a kind of compendium, to be consulted whenever a general question about some aspect of fuzzy logic arises. The carefully compiled and structured subject and name indexes support such an approach. In any case, the book will certainly remain an invaluable resource for more than one class of readers for quite some time.