G. E. Moore's Ethical Theory: Resistance and Reconciliation

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Hutchinson, Brian, G. E. Moore's Ethical Theory: Resistance and Reconciliation, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 228pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521800552

Reviewed by Philip Stratton-Lake, University of Reading


In G. E. Moore’s Ethical Theory, Brian Hutchinson paints a picture of Moore as both a revolutionary and as a conservative. His revolutionary impulse is his desire to break with the philosophical tradition that has committed the naturalistic fallacy. His conservative impulse is his desire to retain the simple truths of common sense. Hutchinson tries to push the revolutionary side in such a way as to see Moore as a close precursor of the later Wittgenstein, and suggests a way of steering between his anti-philosophical, revolutionary side and his conservatism.

In his Introduction, Hutchinson notes the view according to which Moore’s attempt to defend an objectivist ethics backfires and leads to emotivism. Hutchinson blames the open-question argument for this image of Moore as the great destroyer. He argues that by playing down this aspect of Moore’s ethics, his overall view will be far more attractive. He rejects Regan’s interpretation of Moore as offering a quasi-existentialist ethics. If ‘good’ is indefinable, then no algorithm can be provided to prove one ethical judgment against another. But, Hutchinson argues, this does not mean that each individual must make up their own mind on evaluative questions; at least not if this is thought to imply some sort of relativism. On this Hutchinson is surely right. He ends this chapter by claiming:

the deepest impulse of Moore’s philosophy is, as Wittgenstein’s is, to end philosophy. Moore’s great aim in ethics is to expose and expunge philosophy’s revisionary impulse in order to defend the things we know to be irreplaceable in any sane way of life… Some things philosophers must simply accept. But promulgating such a position within philosophy appears to undermine it. (13)

So, although Moore is not a moral revisionist, he is a philosophical revolutionary, in Hutchinson’s view. We should regard Moore’s philosophy as anti-philosophy: ‘the sole job of philosophy is to resist philosophy’ (14).

It turns out then that playing down the only argument Moore offers us for the naturalistic fallacy has considerable consequences for how we view Moore’s relation to philosophy itself. I have to say that I find myself on the side of those who think that there is (at least) something to be said for the open-question argument. Both Frankena’s criticisms and advances in semantic theory raise considerable difficulties for this argument, but I do not think these difficulties should lead us to reject it. Consequently, I am less inclined to go along with the anti-philosophical line of thought that emerges if we do abandon Moore’s argument.

In the rest of the book, Hutchinson clarifies the central concepts in Moore’s Principia and traces the conservative and revolutionary impulses that run through that book. In chapter one, he focuses on the notions of simplicity, indefinability, and non-naturalness. He argues that the most important claim Moore makes relates to the indefinability of ‘good’, which Moore often used interchangeably with the simplicity of good. He also argues that the notion of a simple property is ambiguous. Being simple can be understood as having no more than one part, or as being most general. Hutchinson claims, however, that this ambiguity does not raise any difficulties for Moore’s claim about goodness. (23).

Hutchinson is right that Moore regarded simplicity as basic and just assumed that non-naturalness followed from simplicity. Hutchinson is also right that Moore was mistaken in this. There is nothing about simple properties which implies that they are non-natural. There is nothing incoherent about a simple natural or metaphysical property. Consequently, one cannot conclude that goodness is a non-natural property simply by showing that it is a simple property. One has to argue for non-naturalness in some other way. But although Hutchinson is aware that non-naturalness does not follow from simplicity, he does seem to think that simplicity follows from non-naturalness. (34) This is, however, a mistake. Intuitionists like A. C. Ewing disagreed with Moore that ‘good’ is a simple property, though they agreed with him that it is a non-natural property.

In chapter two, Hutchinson clarifies further the notion of good’s non-naturalness. Much of this involves clarifying the notion of an object existing outside of time with reference to Moore’s earlier works. What Hutchinson has to say here is very informative. But although Moore does describe a non-natural property in the way Hutchinson states, it is not the only way in which he describes it. Elsewhere Moore describes a natural property as one that it is the business of the natural sciences or psychology to study. According to this account of the natural, a non-natural property will be one that it is not the business of the natural sciences or psychology to study. Now this account needs filling out, since the term ‘natural’ appears in the definition. Nonetheless, it does seem to capture what Moore was maintaining in claiming that goodness is a non-natural property in a way that the account Hutchinson focuses on does not. It is also the account that Moore favored in the Preface to the second edition of Principia. The problem with focusing on the identification of non-naturalness with ‘outside-of-time-ness’ is that it forces us to buy into other aspects of Moore’s metaphysics, aspects which are much more dubious than anything he says in Principia. It also adds to the air of mystery many think surrounds goodness as Moore understands it.

The rest of the chapter focuses on criticizing the open-question argument. Hutchinson claims that there is a sense in which Moore is simply begging the question, because he is merely inviting us to see that two properties are different. According to Hutchinson, Moore’s argument is not an argument at all. It is, rather, ‘a means for the attainment of an epiphany’. The risk of philosophy is that its demand for justification leads us to lose this simple insight, and to identify goodness with something else.

In chapter three, Hutchinson considers the prospects for philosophy given that in ethics it seems blind to the simple truths of common sense. How is it that so many philosophers could have made the simple mistake of confusing good with some natural property? Isn’t this just like confusing red with blue? Hutchinson tries to address this question by pointing out the various ways in which value is different from color. These differences show that there is no possibility of direct knowledge of good. The nature of goodness is only locatable after philosophical reflection on the concepts surrounding it. (75) Consequently, the failing of past philosophers is not a failure to see a simple truth (70). This point is pursued further in chapter four. Here Hutchinson argues that Moore should embrace a more controversy-friendly conception of the future of philosophy and be more sympathetic to past philosophers, rather than see the repeated iteration of a simple mistake.

In chapter five, Hutchinson takes up the suggestion proposed in the introduction that Moore’s philosophy is more plausible if the open-question argument is abandoned. By focusing on Moore’s actual theory rather than on his statement and application of it, we find a richer conception of moral epistemology that is less revolutionary and more friendly to common sense, according to Hutchinson.

In chapter six, Hutchinson turns to Moore’s critique of egoism. He examines the nature of the assumptions that lie in the background of Moore’s critique, and how this argument sheds light on the tension between Moore’s conservative and revolutionary impulses. He finishes by evaluating the argument itself and considering what views Moore’s argument commits him to.

In chapter seven, Hutchinson continues with Moore’s critique of egoism. He examines Moore’s attempt to diagnose and weaken the hold that egoism has on us, considers what aspects of human life Moore’s argument threatens, and finally argues that Moore’s attempt to weaken the revolutionary implications of his argument with an alternative notion of self-interest fails. Hutchinson makes a number of sensible points here, but I thought that he could have been a bit more sympathetic to Moore at times.

In chapter eight, Hutchinson turns to Moore’s consequentialism. Once again he argues that there are both conservative and radical elements to Moore’s views. Moore is a conservative about rules that are necessary for civilized life and is deeply suspicious of revisionary rules invented by philosophers. What is not clear is his attitude towards rules that are in place in various societies, but are not necessary for civilized life. Hutchinson argues (against Regan) that Moore’s view about these rules is closer to that of the first, rather than to the rules invented by philosophers.

In chapter nine, Hutchinson examines Moore’s notion of the ideal. He claims that once again Moore plays the arch-conservative, defending the naïve view about what is good as strongly as he does the naïve view about what goodness is, though philosophers misconceive this and hence see the world as seriously deficient. Since Moore does not regard the world as deficient in this way, he has no need to offer some form of redemption (174). As Hutchinson understands him, all Moore wants to deliver us from is a conception of the world that requires redemption. This seems to me to be a philosophically interesting way of approaching Moore. Hutchinson thinks this leads Moore into a paradox. To reject the philosophical revision of the world requires him to make sense of the philosopher’s view of the world, but in doing this Moore must lose his innocence, and the simple insights that go along with this.(176) But I do not think Moore is, or aims to be, the sort philosophical innocent that Hutchinson portrays, and which generates this paradox. His defense of common sense is backed by various arguments both in Principia and elsewhere. In Some Main Problems of Philosophy and ‘Some Judgments of Perception’ he puts forward his ‘degrees of certainty’ anti-skeptical argument that turns the skeptic’s modus ponens into a modus tollens, and in ‘The Defense of Common Sense’ he argues that scepticism involves a sort of pragmatic incoherence – that is, it involves a contradiction between what the skeptic asserts and what he implies by this assertion.

In the final chapter, Hutchinson considers whether Moore’s theory of art fits comfortably with his ‘cosmic conservatism’, or whether it is a manifestation of a view of the world as inadequate. Why contemplate unreal art objects if real ones need no improvement? The question that arises from this is how there can be idealization without alienation. What is needed is some sort of reconciliation. But Hutchinson maintains the nature of philosophy is such that any reconciliation would itself be called into question and the dichotomy reopened. We have then something like a dialectic of enlightenment, where philosophy both undermines the simple truths of common sense as well as its own systematic alternative. As Hutchinson puts it:

We thus find ourselves with, on the one hand, thought that is incapable of going even the tiniest distance beyond the hidebound conservatism and blind allegiance to common sense that Moore pledges in The Elements of Ethics and on the other, with thought that is utterly anarchical.

Hutchinson argues that the notions of the beautiful and the interesting can somehow end this dialect by bridging the gap that separates the actual and the ideal.

The sleeve of Hutchinson’s book claims that it is ‘the first comprehensive account of the ethics of G. E. Moore’, but it does not offer such an account. Such an account would have to consider the various ways in which Moore came to clarify and revise what he said in Principia, and Hutchinson doesn’t do this. What he does is offer an interesting and fresh reading of Moore’s Principia. I am sympathetic to the view that philosophy should be as faithful possible to common sense, but do not share Hutchinson’s rather pessimistic view about the possibility of achieving this goal. In the end, I was not persuaded that Moore shared this pessimistic view either.