Gadamer: A Philosophical Portrait

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Donatella Di Cesare, Gadamer: A Philosophical Portrait, Niall Keane (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2013, 233pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253007636.

Reviewed by Francis J. Mootz III, McGeorge School of Law, University of the Pacific


Donatella Di Cesare has written a wonderfully self-reflexive book. What does it mean to claim to have created a portrait of Hans-Georg Gadamer as a philosopher, given that Gadamer regarded the experience of art, and particularly the experience of viewing a portrait, as having profound significance for hermeneutical philosophy? Gadamer emphasized that the portrait necessarily moves beyond pure representation because the meaning of the subject of the portrait is augmented through the play that occurs while viewing the portrait. Di Cesare’s portrait of Gadamer succeeds because it exemplifies, amplifies and exceeds our previous understanding of Gadamer, working from the readers' starting points and stimulating them with new insights. The emerging portrait is at once challenging and provocative; of course, Gadamer would argue that a portrait should be nothing less.

The book truly works as a portrait, beginning with a succinct bibliographic chapter that unites Gadamer’s life and his philosophy. From the early death of his humanistic mother and the challenges presented by his stern and scientific father; to his troubled relationship with Heidegger to whom he was loyal even as he made significant breaks with him in his work; through the war years in Germany and the later unfounded attacks on hermeneutical philosophy for alleged intellectual complicity in the horror; and, finally, to his magnum opus, written as a capstone by a thinker who preferred dialogue and debate to the writing of ponderous and enigmatic philosophy texts. Di Cesare admits that her portrait of Gadamer presumes a “Socratic harmony of logos and ergon -- word and deed -- in order to let the unity of his philosophy emerge -- with the awareness that, despite the intervening distance, every portrait is an idealization” (3). Di Cesare does not overly idealize philosophical hermeneutics, but by linking it to the powerful and inspiring figure of Gadamer she certainly provides a positive account of its legacy.

The book is a pleasure to read because the writing is clean and efficient without ever being simplistic or trite. This is a testament to Di Cesare, but it also reflects the excellent work of the translator, Niall Keane. Given the range of topics addressed by a philosopher who remained active until his death at 102, there are inevitable truncations that cause the book to read too abruptly. This results more from the challenge posed by the subject of the portrait rather than from a lack of the author’s artistry. The book is a stimulating read that unites clear prose, depth of inquiry, and unified themes. It is a starting point for hermeneutical thought, rather than an encyclopedic account or a tin-eared critical intervention.

Di Cesare begins by arguing that scholars have mistakenly conflated Gadamer’s philosophical contributions with Truth and Method (TM), missing the distinctiveness of his work that preceded and followed the publication of his signature book. It might be surprising then, that the book generally follows the format of TM. Beginning with Gadamer’s focus on the event of truth that outstrips the scientific method, the book proceeds to discuss the exemplary experience of art, Gadamer’s recasting of the hermeneutical tradition into a philosophical approach to understanding, and finally presents Gadamer’s philosophy of language. Di Cesare includes helpful chapters on the ethical dimensions of hermeneutics and Gadamer’s recovery of Greek philosophy within this familiar framework, but TM clearly provides the organizational architecture of the book. A more disruptive reading of the legacy of TM might have proved interesting, but using earlier and later work to extend and deepen the lines of inquiry in TM is the most responsible approach to capture the enduring effects of Gadamer’s philosophy.

In a short chapter Di Cesare offers an account of how Gadamer “constructed” hermeneutics by strongly (and sometimes inaccurately) reading the modern tradition of Schleiermacher, Dilthey and Heidegger against a backdrop that extends from the ancient Greeks through Vico. If he was too one-sided in casting Schleiermacher as an exemplar of the romantic/psychological branch of hermeneutics, Gadamer also was too respectful of his debt to Heidegger. Against Habermas’s claim that Gadamer urbanized the Heideggerian province, Di Cesare shows how Gadamer broke with Heidegger in many important respects, but also how he hewed to the early Heidegger of the Hermeneutics of Facticity against Heidegger’s later increasingly “solipsistic disquiet” (80). Situating Gadamer in the tradition of hermeneutical thinking, and reassessing his effective history in the light of historical distance, proves to be one of the most helpful features of the book.

The key to Gadamer’s philosophy is his questioning of truth. The event of truth is revealed by distinguishing “understanding” as a way of being from “interpretation” as an activity that one might take up in response to a problem. The hermeneutical tradition, as reconstructed by Gadamer, sought to find the key to valid interpretation. As methodologism spread from the sciences to the humanities, scholars subjected the traditional exegetical rules of biblical and legal hermeneutics to more exacting expectations. In the end, the truths that might be derived by methodological interpretive strategies were elusive. The signature insight of philosophical hermeneutics is that the humanities need not bend to the rigor of method or remain content with the subjectivism of aesthetics. Gadamer confronts the Kantian dilemma by recovering the event of truth in understanding. Di Cesare emphasizes this starting point: “Understanding means not conceiving, dominating, or controlling. Understanding is like breathing. And one does not decide not to breathe any more. Understanding is not a matter of knowing, but of being” (p. 38).

The chapter that describes the experience of art serves the same purpose as Part I of TM. Art exemplifies the experience of being and poses a persistent challenge to the objectifying goals of modern thought. In short, “Truth is at stake in art” (65). Gadamer explores the phenomenology of play as providing the key insight into the ontology of art, and Di Cesare carefully recounts this exploration while deepening it. In particular, she expands on the origins of theoria as the immersion in a festival in ancient Greece. Theoria is only mentioned at this juncture in TM, but it plays an important role in Gadamer’s philosophy, and it is one point of deep connection to Heidegger. It becomes clear that art is the gateway to the universality of hermeneutics as an inquiry into our mode of being as playful understanding, which always already subtends our wanting and willing. This chapter provides an excellent overview of a critical step on the path to philosophical hermeneutics.

In chapter five, “The Constellation of Understanding,” the portrait begins to lose definition and to resemble a collage. Building on Heidegger’s recovery of the hermeneutical circle as a positive account of understanding, Part II of  TM seeks to uncover the event of truth that the humanities foster. Gadamer’s wide-ranging discussions of “prejudice,” “tradition,” “history of effects,” “application,” “the classical,” “fusion of horizons,” and “experience” is rich and learned. However, in this small volume it would have been best to orient these themes and provide more focus to the arc of Gadamer’s philosophy. Di Cesare concludes the chapter by correctly noting that the concept of understanding “reaches its greatest extension with the concept of experience after that of application” (106). This insight should have served as the organizing framework. Working from the ontology of the artwork as play, Di Cesare could have explored the concept of “application” that is introduced at a critical juncture of Part II and then considered “experience” in terms of Bildung and the distinction between Erfahrung and Erlebnis. Instead of attempting to do justice to a number of concepts and experiences by devoting a few pages to each, a more thematic approach would have provided an illuminating framework within which to review the rich terminology employed in Part II of TM. This would also have led very naturally into the following chapter on ethics, in which application and experience play central roles.

The concluding part of TM concerns the linguisticality of human understanding, anticipating the later “linguistic turn” that captivated philosophy in succeeding decades. Di Cesare concedes that Gadamer’s discussion is unsatisfactory, and perhaps largely ignored, because he was at the forefront of the turn to language. In one of the longest chapters of the book, Di Cesare reconstructs Gadamer’s linguistic philosophy in light of his later work and subsequent developments in the field. Of particular importance is her discussion of Gadamer’s famously misunderstood statement: “Being that can be understood is language.” Gadamer does not equate Being with language, and in fact emphasizes the limits of language and the excess of Being in the experience of the ineffable.

The experience of the boundaries of language is thus the experience of the boundaries of our existence and our finitude. The search for the right word appears to be an endless task. On the other hand, it is the word that always carries us above and beyond ourselves. (157)

The chapter emphasizes that language is dialogue, a dialogue that is always already underway and never completed. The voice of the other is a persistent challenge to the pretense of the subject who uses language as a tool, because in dialogue both conversation partners are continually transformed.

Gadamer’s emphasis on the significance of dialogue dispels the widespread misunderstanding that his philosophical hermeneutics is premised on reaching agreement. Jacques Derrida and Paul Ricoeur both challenged Gadamer for claiming that an abiding agreement subtended misunderstandings. Di Cesare makes the case that Gadamer did not naively posit an underlying convergence. Instead, he argued that the recourse to language represents “agreement” in the form of participating in the community of dialogue, but that this dialogue never reaches “agreement” to the point that nothing remains to be said. “Hermeneutics has never campaigned for consensus and reconciliation. The ‘agreement’ from which all speakers proceed is the harmony of a common language. For speaking is always a coming-to-agreement” (212). In response to Habermas, we might say that the problem with the “ideal speech situation” is that if it ever came to pass nobody would have anything to say. The disruption of misunderstanding is inevitable in dialogue between finite persons seeking to understand something under discussion (die Sache) that is not simply an exchange of information taking place against an agreed upon metric. Di Cesare effectively demonstrates that Gadamer charts a course between Heidegger’s hypostasis of language and Wittgenstein’s focus on the speaker engaging in a language game.

The philosophy of finitude is rooted in language, in which each participant is drawn outside herself. There never is a first or last word in dialogue.

It is in the everydayness of the now that both the finitude of every spoken and every understood word, as well as the finitude of the speaker who must rely on the word, are experienced. In this way there arises the unquenched and unquenchable desire for another word, which would give voice each time to what is unsaid and not understood. But this is possible only because the word in its finite presence evokes the absent infinitude of what still remains to be said and what lets itself be said. The limit of every word is thus always the beginning of something infinitely new. For every word demands another word -- in an infinite dialogue. (185)

Gadamer does not deconstruct the metaphysical tradition, but instead philosophizes an ontology of language from within the hermeneutic tradition.

The book concludes by describing the ongoing debates spurred by Gadamer’s philosophy. The efforts by Emilio Betti and E. D. Hirsch to revive objective methods to discern the drafter’s intention might seem to be strange developments to assess, since these strategies no longer carry much weight with philosophers. However, in the U.S. theories of interpretation of the constitution and statutes reanimate these theories under the banner of “new originalism.” We must continually slay the dragon, it seems, and so this reminder of the initial response to Gadamer’s hermeneutical philosophy is appropriate. Philosophical hermeneutics has benefitted by addressing the far more sophisticated critiques by Habermas, Rorty, Derrida and Giani Vattimo. These confrontations have modeled the hermeneutic ethic, as each philosopher emerged from the debate with a different understanding and self-understanding. Di Cesare concludes that hermeneutics was strengthened by these debates, but at the same time it was weakened by the fact that hermeneutics became a “koiné, a kind of common idiom, which can easily be instrumentalized because it has been robbed of nearly all its semantic density” (194).

Perhaps the enduring legacy of philosophical hermeneutics will best be realized in the current efforts to reorient inquiry into the hermeneutics of the Other. Gadamer’s insistence that the priority of hermeneutics is a belonging together in the linguisticality of understanding is the basis for understanding the impossibility of subsuming the other to one’s own understanding.

Hermeneutics has never campaigned for consensus and reconciliation. The ‘agreement’ from which all speakers proceed is the harmony of a common language. For speaking is always a coming-to-agreement. The other is already recognized here: even before every agreement with oneself, each speaker comes to an agreement with the other. Hence, to speak means to articulate the linguistic commonality further and otherwise. That does not prevent language, however, in its always open movement between familiarity and foreignness, understanding and nonunderstanding, from offering not only the starting point but also the paradigm of an ethics, a politics, or justice, which can be thought on the basis of its hospitable, common, and nevertheless differentiating in-between. This in-between is the space for the other and with the other, the undetermined of hermeneutic truth, and the finite meeting point of common words, which opens participation in the infinitude of the dialogue. (212-13)

In the end it is Socrates, Gadamer’s true philosophical guide, who embodies philosophical hermeneutics as an unceasing dialogue. And this portrait can never be completed.