Gadamer and the Legacy of German Idealism

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Kristin Gjesdal, Gadamer and the Legacy of German Idealism, Cambridge UP, 2009, 235pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521509640.

Reviewed by Robert Dostal, Bryn Mawr College



As the title suggests, this is a work that examines the relation of Gadamer’s hermeneutics to German Idealism. Gjesdal reminds us with the motto of the book that Gadamer himself writes that his starting point was a “critique of German Idealism and its Romantic traditions” from a Heideggerian point of view. Gjesdal’s central thesis is that Gadamer espouses “an aestheticizing model of understanding” that “prevents him from developing an adequate notion of normative issues in hermeneutics” (p. 3). Her critique of Gadamerian hermeneutics, which is developed by the consideration of Gadamer’s reading of Kant, Hegel, and the Romantics, represented especially by Schleiermacher, leads her to endorse, against Gadamer, the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher: “I recommend a return to the early nineteenth-century theory of interpretation” (p. 4).

The first section of the book provides a close reading of the first part of Truth and Method, in which Gadamer criticizes Kant’s aesthetics as leading to the subjectification of aesthetics. Gjesdal’s treatment of Gadamer’s reading of Kant’s aesthetics is careful and nuanced. She deals well with Gadamer’s treatment of the concept of the “ideal of beauty,” the distinction between the beauty of nature and art, and the concepts of taste and genius. Yet her discussion does not sufficiently appreciate the rhetorical and substantive context of Gadamer’s reading of Kant. Gadamer is more interested in the reception (Wirkungsgeschichte) of Kant than with Kant himself. Gadamer is most directly concerned with rejecting the much prevailing Neo-Kantian view of “art for art’s sake” and the non-cognitive status of art and aesthetic experience. He finds the roots of this view in Kant, but full-blown Neo-Kantian aesthetics, according to Gadamer, rely importantly, if not transparently, on developments in romanticism and German Idealism. Thus, I do not think it fair to speak of Gadamer “misreading” Kant on natural beauty because he evaluates Kant’s concept of natural beauty from the standpoint of fine art (p. 76). This is a development in the aesthetics of German Idealism that Gadamer recognizes but does not endorse. He recognizes a loss in this move. Gadamer treats these developments in order to begin to make the case for an alternative aesthetics that accepts the truthfulness of aesthetic experience. Gjesdal acknowledges that “according to Kant, our relation to beauty is not of a direct cognitive nature.” She goes on to say that “it is an open question as to what extent Gadamer, given his focus on the hermeneutic nature of art, really is able to offer an adequate interpretation of Kant’s approach to beauty” (p. 44). Here she recognizes Gadamer’s project as the context for his reading of Kant. For Gjesdal, inasmuch as Gadamer fundamentally disagrees with Kant, his interpretation is suspect.

When Gjesdal turns to Gadamer in relation to romanticism and Hegel, she argues both that Gadamer relies on Hegel’s critique of Romanticism to overcome aesthetic consciousness (p. 109) and that, in the end, Gadamer’s own position is a kind of “naïve romanticism” (p. 113). On her account Gadamer’s reliance on Hegel concerns 1) the critique of Kant’s view of natural beauty, 2) the critique of romanticism’s aesthetic subjectivism, and 3) the “historical and ethical-political accent of his understanding of the world-disclosive truth of art” (p. 109). Her claim about Gadamer’s own “naïve romanticism” rests on two aspects of his account of aesthetic experience. First, against Hegel and with Romanticism, Gadamer rejects the superiority of the concept over art. Secondly, though Gadamer rejects the subjectivism of romanticism, Gadamer endorses the “immediacy” of aesthetic experience. Gjesdal writes that “even though Gadamer … manages to overcome the subjectivization of art in post-Kantian aesthetics, he fails to overcome the immediacy problem that he also ascribes to aesthetic consciousness” (p. 82).

Gjesdal sees a deep tension in Gadamer’s ontological hermeneutics, between dialogue and reflection and what she calls “non-dialogical world disclosure” (p. 83). The former she accords largely to Hegel; the latter, to Heidegger. Gadamer attempts to have his Hegel and Heidegger too and Gjesdal does not see how this is possible. She argues that there is a lack of fit between his Hegelian and his Heideggerian commitments. The Heideggerian view of truth, according to Gjesdal, “hypostasizes a notion of immediacy” (p. 82). It also shows a “problematic preference for pre-modern art” (p. 82). Though both these moments, dialogue (and reflection) and the event of truth, are important to Gadamer’s account of beauty, for Gjesdal the latter finally trumps the former. On her account of Gadamer’s aesthetics, “art … reflects … values that transcend the scope of critical reflection and judgment” (p. 104).

This leads Gjesdal to a discussion of Gadamer’s relation to the Enlightenment and the criticism by a number of leading German philosophers that Gadamer’s thought is anti-Enlightenment. She defends Gadamer against the criticisms of Ernst Tugendhat, Karl-Otto Apel, and Jürgen Habermas. She writes that these critics “underestimate Gadamer’s commitment to reflection and self-understanding” (p. 120). However, after giving Gadamer his due and showing how Gadamer’s critique of the Enlightenment is an immanent and not an external critique, Gjesdal argues that Gadamer’s understanding of the Enlightenment is “too negative” (p. 131). It is unnecessarily polemical with regard to prejudice. And, more importantly, it misreads Hegel’s notion of self-understanding. Gjesdal distinguishes between a historical-epistemic and a historical-existential notion of self-understanding. The latter considers self-understanding as a matter of authenticity. This is Gadamer’s Heideggerian notion. The former, and more genuinely Hegelian notion, considers self-understanding as a matter of rational justification.

Here Gjesdal turns to Schleiermacher. She accuses Gadamer of providing a distorted picture of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics in Truth and Method. She acknowledges that Gadamer admits in his later writing that his treatment of Schleiermacher in Truth and Method was not adequate but she finds Gadamer’s later revision of his assessment of Schleiermacher to be merely “cosmetic” (p. 156). Gjesdal makes excellent usage of the extensive secondary literature on Schleiermacher. She points out that Schleiermacher is important for Gadamer’s purposes because of a basic affinity. This affinity is the universalizing of the hermeneutic problem. Schleiermacher is important for Gjesdal’s project because he “and his generation plot a way to reinsert a notion of objectivity into hermeneutics” (p. 156). For Gjesdal, Schleiermacher promises no final interpretation or ultimate justification of an interpretation. Interpretation remains an endless task. This idea he shares with Gadamer. But Schleiermacher does not, as Gadamer does: 1) collapse the self and other, 2) filter the past through the present, 3) collapse meaning and application, 4) assimilate translation to interpretation, and 5) abandon the question of validity. Gadamer, according to Gjesdal, “sublates” truth as validity and justification into truth as authenticity and self-understanding. For Schleiermacher, on her reading, the primary interpretative focus is on the other as other, while the focus for Gadamer is on self-understanding. There is too much potential in the Gadamerian paradigm for the projection of the self onto the other, the projection of one’s own prejudices on the text. This focus on self-understanding rather than the understanding of the other leads Gadamer, according to Gjesdal, to focus too narrowly on the question of interpretation within a tradition without adequate attention to the question of understanding between traditions. She criticizes Charles Taylor for praising Gadamer for his approach to the dialogue between cultures.

Gjesdal argues that Gadamer approaches the question of hermeneutics and its history with a simple either/or. Either hermeneutics is scientistic or it is Heideggerian, that is, hermeneutical experience is the self-transformative ontological experience of Dasein being-in. She importantly claims that Schleiermachian hermeneutics provides an alternative to this too narrow tertium non datur of Gadamer. Gadamer reads Schleiermacher too reductionistically — as a Cartesian and proto-positivist. This follows from Gadamer’s either/or. For Gjesdal Schleiermachian hermeneutics provides a way to preserve a concern for the correctness of an interpretation without succumbing to a narrow methodologism or positivist approach.

In her attempt to make sense of Gadamer’s mistaken reading of Schleiermacher and Gadamer’s own mistaken hermeneutics, Gjesdal writes that in the 1930’s “against the aesthetic humanism of the time he [Gadamer] musters a political humanism” (p. 175). Gjesdal does not adequately explain why she calls Gadamer’s humanism a “political” humanism. It appears that it is “political” in the sense that his humanism is taken to be relevant to the historical situation and is not merely “aesthetic” in the sense of “art for art’s sake” — a bounded realm not relevant to other human involvements, ethical and political. This makes sense, yet the term “political” in the context of the challenge of the 1930’s suggests more political implications and involvement than Gadamer’s hermeneutics provides. In the extensive literature concerning Gadamer’s hermeneutics no one else has called Gadamer’s humanism “political.”

There is much to praise in this lucidly written critique of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Gjesdal clearly shows the inadequacy of Gadamer’s reading of Schleiermacher. She is not the first critic to raise the question of the correctness or validity of interpretation but, unlike any other critic, she develops the question well in the context of her discussion of Gadamer’s reading of Kant, Schleiermacher and Hegel. In her conclusion she acknowledges that Schleiermacher and Gadamer talk past one another in the sense that “Schleiermacher does not deal with the kind of deep-seated problem of existential-ontological meaning that Gadamer inherits from Heidegger” (p. 214). At the same time, she insists that “the stark opposition between validity and historicity in interpretation” that Gadamer maintains is a fundamental mistake. She restates her thesis that for Gadamer the “critical-reflective capacity of the interpreter is suspended in encountering the authority of tradition” (p. 215). At several critical junctures in the text she refers to the “passive” role of the interpreter according to Gadamer. However much she shows sympathy for Gadamer’s project, in the end she agrees with the criticism of Habermas, Tugendhat, Apel and others that Gadamer is a traditionalist whose taste is pre-modern.

I would suggest that her account of Gadamer’s hermeneutics importantly ignores the role of the Sache (whatever the text or speech is about) and Sachlichkeit (sometimes translated as “objectivity”). She continually renders what it is that is at stake in an interpretation for Gadamer as self-understanding. Against her reading of Gadamer, I would argue that what is at stake in the first place for Gadamer in interpretation is the truth of the thing about which the speech is spoken or the text is written. It is true that self-understanding is also always at stake. It is at stake, however, in the sense that Socrates says in the Phaedrus that all he has ever done is try to understand himself. And the Socratic way to seek such an understanding is to ask questions that typically are of the form “What is it?” The questions are not, in the first place, about himself. This brings to the fore another inevitable shortcoming of a work like this, which places Gadamer’s hermeneutics in relation to Kant and 19th century German philosophy. One cannot make adequate sense of Gadamer’s hermeneutics without recognizing its attempt to recover basic insights from Aristotle and, perhaps more importantly, Plato. This recognition leads one to see a somewhat greater distance between Gadamer’s hermeneutics and the philosophy of Heidegger than that recognized in this account by Gjesdal. She does recognize some distance between Gadamer and Heidegger in Gadamer’s humanism and his concern for dialogue. Further, I think she is right to see Gadamer’s reliance on Heidegger’s notion of truth, though I would suggest (and have argued in print) that Gadamer does not think of truth as Heidegger does, as the sudden flash of insight. Nonetheless, let me conclude this review with the summary statement that Gjesdal’s work provides a powerful challenge to Gadamer’s hermeneutics and good reasons to revisit 19th century hermeneutics.