Gadamer's Century: Essays in Honor of Hans-Georg Gadamer

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Malpas, Jeff, Ulrich Arnswald, and Jens Kertscher (eds.), Gadamer's Century: Essays in Honor of Hans-Georg Gadamer, The MIT Press, 2002, xiv + 363 pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-262-63247-0.

Reviewed by Richard E. Palmer, MacMurray College (Illinois)


Gadamer’s Century is an impressive set of seventeen essays honoring the hundredth anniversary of Hans-Georg Gadamer, who died on March 13, 2002. Assembling the collection was a project of the European Institute for International Affairs in Heidelberg. It presents a worthy international tribute to a philosopher whose life spanned the twentieth century. Contributors to the volume, in addition to its three editors listed below, are Hans Albert, Gerald Bruns, John M. Connolly, Jay Garfield, Robert Holub, Alasdair MacIntyre, John McDowell, Robert Pippin, Paul Ricoeur, Stanley Rosen, Lawrence Schmidt, Charles Taylor, Gianni Vattimo, and Georgia Warnke. The three editors are not principally Gadamer students and thus bring international and philosophical balance to the volume.

Appropriately, the volume begins with a 12-page biography, “Hans-Georg Gadamer: A Biographical Sketch,” by Lawrence Schmidt. Schmidt deftly sketches the life of Gadamer from his birth in Marburg in 1900 to the centennial celebration of his hundredth birthday in Heidelberg on February 11, 2000. High points were his bout with crippling polio at age 22, the five years of study with Heidegger in Marburg from 1923-1928, his experiences during the Hitler years and his struggle to survive as a professor in Leipzig, Frankfurt, and Heidelberg, during and after the Second World War. In the 1950s he put together his masterwork, Truth and Method, published in 1960. International fame came with the publication of the volume, although it was not translated until 1975. After his retirement in 1969, he accepted invitations to speak and teach from all over the world and became an international traveling scholar. Many books followed, most of them collecting his many lectures. Two dozen of these are listed in the twelve-page bibliography of Gadamer’s Century.

Schmidt acknowledges his debt to the 437-page magisterial biography by Jean Grondin, Hans-Georg Gadamer: Eine Biographie, (Mohr, 1997). A shorter biographical source is Gadamer’s sixty-page autobiographical sketch in the Library of Living Philosophers volume, The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer edited by Lewis Hahn (Open Court Press, 1997), 3-63. This volume contains in its 619 pages some twenty-nine essays on Gadamer’s philosophy along with Gadamer’s reply to each. Interestingly enough, this volume and Gadamer’s Century supplement rather than overlap each other! The only commenter to appear in both volumes is Stanley Rosen, and essays by such well-known authors as Alasdair MacIntyre, Paul Ricoeur, Charles Taylor and Gianni Vattimo particularly enhance the more recent volume.

Following the biographical sketch, the commentary essays in Gadamer’s Century appear in alphabetical order, beginning with Hans Albert’s “Critical Rationalism and Universal Hermeneutics” (pp. 15-24). Albert acknowledges his early and “sometimes harsh attacks” on Gadamer in defense of his own “critical rationalism” (15). His Treatise on Critical Reason (1968) gives a clear statement of his position and has been translated into English (1985). A follower of Karl Popper, Albert is referred to in Grondin’s biography as “Gadamer’s Antipode” (cited above, 331). Albert’s conciliatory remarks here are a pleasant surprise and illustrate an important aspect of Gadamer’s personality. He remarks, “Gadamer has always shown a kind disposition toward me that cannot be taken for granted and that I am bound to respect” (15). It was not Gadamer’s style to attack or counterattack, although his masterwork was taken by many as an attack on traditional scholarly values and method. He answered criticisms carefully and replied to objections by Emilio Betti, Jürgen Habermas, and other detractors.

Ulrich Arnswald’s “On the Certainty of Uncertainty: Language Games and Forms of Life in Gadamer and Wittgenstein” (pp. 25-44) presents a lengthy account of Wittgenstein before turning to Gadamer and argues that there are many similarities between Wittgenstein’s “language games” and “forms of life” and parallel concepts found in Gadamer. He concludes that “Gadamerian hermeneutics have to be used as an extension to the discussion of forms of life and language games” (40).

Gerald Bruns offers “The Hermeneutical Anarchist: Phronesis, Rhetoric, and the Experience of Art” (pp. 45-76). Referring to Christopher Smith’s The Hermeneutics of Original Argument: Demonstration, Dialectic, Rhetoric (Northwestern, 1998), Bruns argues that phronesis and the “rhetoric of original argument” show the possibility of a more modest form of rational argument “within the limits of human finitude,” which he provocatively calls “an anarchic rationality” (55). For Bruns, this discussion leads directly into Gadamer’s account of the experience of works of art, including modernist art, whose meaning we must construct in each encounter. “In Gadamer’s aesthetics the event of encountering the work of art is not a museum event in which we simply gape at the thing; it is an event in which the work claims a place in the world we inhabit—indeed, it is right to say that the work claims a piece of us and insists on belonging to our lives” (65). It is “an event of witness, testimony, and appropriation.” (65) Bruns’ well-argued essay demonstrates the significance of Gadamer’s hermeneutics for rethinking the history of rhetoric and for understanding art.

In “Applicatio and Explicatio in Gadamer and Eckhart” (pp. 77-96), John M. Connolly examines Gadamer’s hermeneutical concepts of applicatio and explicatio and shows them to be clearly at work in the highly allegorical sermons of Meister Eckhart.

Jay L. Garfield reflects in “Philosophy, Religion, and the Hermeneutic Imperative” (pp. 97-110) on the academic categories of religion and philosophy as misleading in relation to non-Western philosophies. He notes that Western philosophy has sided with science and “explicitly defined itself in contrast with religion” (103), yet at the same time even Western philosophy (Kant, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche) never fully repudiates its Semitic origins (103). Gadamer’s hermeneutical philosophy enters the picture in that it repudiates many traditional dualities in philosophy, especially the duality of truth and method (107). Garfield also demonstrates the usefulness of Gadamer’s hermeneutical philosophy in helping to bridge the gap between Western and non-Western thought.

Robert C. Holub’s “Understanding Perspectivism: Nietzsche’s Dialogue with his Contemporaries” (pp. 111-133) focuses, as the title indicates, on Nietzsche, with a link to the Gadamer-Derrida encounter, where Derrida criticized Heidegger’s interpretation of Nietzsche. His remarks on Nietzsche are intended as background for the well-known encounter between Gadamer and Derrida.

In his essay, “’We Understand Differently, If We Understand At All’: Gadamer’s Ontology of Language Reconsidered,” Jens Kertscher, one of the editors of the volume, objects to Gadamer’s reliance on tradition in developing an antiobjectivist view of language. He finds contradictions in Gadamer’s ontology of language that can only be remedied, he argues, by a Wittgensteinian emphasis on language games and praxis. It would seem that Kertscher begins with Wittgensteinian presuppositions and on this basis evaluates Gadamer’s hermeneutics and the Heideggerian concept of a truth disclosed in art.

Alasdair MacIntyre, in his essay, “On Not Having the Last Word: Thoughts on Our Debts to Gadamer” (pp. 157-172), takes a quite different approach to Gadamer from Kertscher. He does not offer critique, primarily, but rather he enters into dialogue with Gadamer as an equal who differs on fundamental points. For his essay he poses the question: “What have I learned and perhaps only could have learned from Gadamer?” He acknowledges his unhappiness with Gadamer’s dismissive attitude to Neo-Thomism and the fact that “Gadamer has never entered into dialogue with a distinctively Thomistic Aristotelianism” (157).

He does make an interesting point by showing that Gadamer offers a clearly better interpretation of Plato than Natorp; this suggests that there is such a thing as progress in philosophy, contrary to a famous assertion of Gadamer to the contrary. Were he still alive, I think Gadamer would reply that what he meant was that philosophy will not ever reach a point where it does not need to read Plato or Aristotle. He finds the scientific view of progress, which dismisses the past, to be unfair, and I think MacIntyre would agree. Indeed, one could note that the argument in Truth and Method also states that certain conceptions, such as “the metaphysical form of idealism since Kant” (cited p. 174), are “outmoded.” At the end of his essay, MacIntyre thanks Gadamer for provoking him to articulate his own thoughts in dialogue with Gadamer. And he praises Gadamer as “the exemplary practitioner of the hermeneutic virtues, both intellectual and moral” (171).

By alphabetical accident, two essays on Gadamer and Davidson occur together: John McDowell’s “Gadamer and Davidson on Understanding and Relativism” (pp. 173-193) and Jeff Malpas’ “Gadamer, Davidson, and the Ground of Understanding” (pp. 195-215). In the first essay, John McDowell continues the admiration for Gadamer’s work he showed in his Mind and World (Harvard University Press, 1994) and defends himself and Gadamer against an attack of relativism leveled by Michael Friedman in a (1996) review of that book. There Friedman argued that by turning to Gadamer McDowell opened himself to the charge of relativism (179). Earlier, Davidson himself had defended himself against the imputation of relativism in his article “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme” in his Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation (Oxford University Press, 1984), 125-140. While both McDowell and Malpas indicate the basic compatibility between the thinking of Gadamer and Davidson, Malpas goes more deeply into the key issue of commonality, the ground of understanding. In his book, Donald Davidson and the Mirror of Meaning: Holism, Truth and Interpretation (Cambridge University Press, 1992), Malpas had gone into the affinities of Davidson with Heidegger, so he is well prepare to go deeper and more systematically into the compatibilities between Gadamer and Davidson with regard to the ground of understanding.

This is among the most significant essays in the collection because it does what Gadamer could not do—build bridges to analytic philosophy. Malpas argues that Davidson and Heidegger and now Gadamer do not ground understanding in some element or single source, “not Dasein, nor Spirit, not Life, nor even History” but rather “in the complex dialogical interplay between speakers and their world,” an interplay that is within language and tradition but “never held captive by them” (212). With his evident understanding of Heidegger, Malpas is able to find exciting connections between the philosophy of Donald Davidson and that of Hans-Georg Gadamer.

Robert B. Pippin, author of Hegel’s Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness (Cambridge University Press, 1989) continues with the theme of self-consciousness in his “Gadamer’s Hegel” (pp. 217-238). Here it is self-consciousness in terms of Gadamer’s interpretation of this theme in Hegel. For Gadamer, influenced by Heidegger, gave hermeneutics the task of “overcoming the primacy of self-consciousness.” Pippin poses the question of whether Heidegger and Gadamer had Hegel or a whole tradition in their sights in this rejection of the concept of self-consciousness (218). In this careful and detailed essay Pippin goes on to show Gadamer’s deep appreciation and debt to Hegel. This is an extremely important essay on Gadamer’s interpretation of Hegel and is a real asset to the volume.

Paul Ricoeur, who has done so much from the French side to define the hermeneutic enterprise, honors the volume with a contribution on “Temporal Distance and Death in History” (pp. 239-255). In this essay he proposes “to extend the discussion” of Gadamer’s concept of Wirkungsgeschichte “by introducing the question of death as a paradigm of distance” (239). He does not have in mind either Heidegger’s highly personalized approach to death as one’s ownmost possibility nor the objectified approach to death that is exemplified in the concession that “one dies” (244). Yet Heidegger, as Ricoeur points out, also employed the concept of “repetition” (from Kierkegaard), which is the actualization of the past, thus anticipating Gadamer’s “superb [and untranslatable] phrase” (250) Wirkungsgeschichte, which actualizes the past in a positive way. Ricoeur’s essay offers a direct interaction with both Heidegger and Gadamer that appreciates and extends further the discussion of temporal distance in interpretation.

Stanley Rosen’s essay, “Are We Such Stuff as Dreams are Made On? Against Reductionism,” takes up the theme of philosophy and poetry that plays such an important role in Gadamer and concludes through a detailed discussion of Plato’s repudiation of poetry. He argues that “philosophers must employ poetry not only to explain life but to praise philosophy and so too dialectic” (265). So he suggests that in order to avoid reductionism philosophers must remember three things: that philosophy “originates from ordinary experience,” that dialectic, following Hegel, must continue to be used to overcome dualisms, and that thinking must be freed from “spontaneously produced laws, rules, or categories that infect the bloodstream of necessity” (275). Rosen here offers a solid, intelligent, and enjoyable brief against reductionism in general but, of course, not all forms of reductionism.

Space does not allow a fair discussion of the content of the three concluding essays in the volume: Charles Taylor’s “Understanding the Other: A Gadamerian View on Conceptual Schemes” (pp. 279-297), Gianni Vattimo’s “Gadamer and the Problem of Ontology” (pp. 299-306), and Georgia Warnke’s “Social Identity as Interpretation” (pp. 307-328). Charles Taylor has been a major interpreter of Gadamer’s significance for the social sciences and this essay extends this contribution. Vattimo is an internationally known Italian follower of Gadamer, whose advocacy of “weak philosophy” has not always pleased the master. He remarks that “as years go by and the Wirkungsgeschichte of Truth and Method matures,” the ontological turn of hermeneutics described in the third part of that masterwork points “in the direction of an identification between transformation and interpretation of the world” (300). Thus, hermeneutics is not just a general theory of understanding that can be accused of relativism; rather, it is an ontology (303). Georgia Warnke’s highly interesting final essay takes up the question of self identity in the context Gadamer’s conceptions of tradition and self-definition, but she takes it a step further to consider in some detail the struggle of women for self-identity. She discusses various current feminist writers and at the end even Foucault’s critique of power structures built into tradition (326).

In sum, this volume is a work of careful scholarship as evidenced by its twelve-page bibliography and seventeen-page index, but more importantly it is a collection of philosophically important essays by internationally recognized scholars. Certainly it is a worthy tribute to Gadamer, but it is more than this. It is a valuable and reliable access to many dimensions of Gadamer’s thought in their present and continuing significance. It explores the parallels in Gadamer to Donald Davidson and Ludwig Wittgenstein, and it lays out the importance of hermeneutics to interpretation theory in the social sciences and to the understanding of non-Western philosophy. It also replies to accusations of relativism and reductionism, shows the connections of hermeneutics to rhetorical theory, and demonstrates the continuing relevance of Gadamer’s interpretations of Plato and Hegel and Heidegger. In short, Gadamer’s Century is a major contribution to Gadamer studies.