Gadamer's Dialectical Hermeneutics

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Lauren Swayne Barthold, Gadamer's Dialectical Hermeneutics, Lexington Books, 2010, 142pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739138878.

Reviewed by Michael Bowler, Michigan Technological University



In Gadamer’s Dialectical Hermeneutics, Barthold takes on at least three interrelated and important scholarly and philosophical tasks. First, she provides an account of the development of Gadamer’s notion of dialectical hermeneutics in its relationship to his reading of Plato and Aristotle, and in particular the manner in which this offers a foundation for a Gadamerian “dialectical ethics.” Second, she situates this notion of dialectical hermeneutics and ethics within the debate coming out of Bernstein, Wachterhauser and others over whether or not Gadamer’s hermeneutics amounts to a form relativism, essentialism, and/or realism and whether or not it has any ethical import or not. Finally, she attempts to formulate the foundations of Gadamer’s dialectical ethics in his analysis of dialogue and its two essential components, solidarity and a transcendent good-beyond-being.

I believe that the analysis that comes out of Barthold’s attempt to fulfill all three tasks is interesting and insightful. In Chapter 1 she examines Gadamer’s reflections on Platonic dialectic and its essential relation to chorismos or separation and in Chapter 2 she looks at Gadamer’s account of the unified role played by theoria and praxis in Aristotle’s ethics and practical philosophy. In Chapter 3, Barthold considers the eventual divisive separation between theoria and praxis in modern accounts of knowledge in conjunction with Gadamer’s attempt to return to Plato and Aristotle in order to retrieve a unity in difference of theoria and praxis in a hermeneutical account of understanding. These three chapters are all fascinating reads that contain substantial insights for those interested in what a dialectical hermeneutics could look like and how it could avoid what many see as the traps of relativism, essentialism and an acontextual, ahistorical realism. Moreover, I think that she is absolutely right to suggest that a proper understanding of solidarity (the “good-for-us”) and a “good-beyond-being,” namely a notion of the good that transcends our momentary desires, beliefs, etc., is crucial to formulating a dialectical ethics of a particular stripe (Chapter 4, but especially Chapter 5). Furthermore, she demonstrates that reading Gadamer can afford us important insights into each of these issues.

Before getting to my critical comments I want to emphasize that I think Gadamer’s Dialectical Hermeneutics is an interesting book that is well worth reading. The orientation of Barthold’s examination of Gadamer is heavily indebted to a neo-pragmatic characterization of the issues involved, especially insofar as it emphasizes the issues of dialogical solidarity and the role of the good-for-us. Yet, and this is the book’s culmination, it attempts to move beyond many such neo-pragmatic readings to the extent that Barthold argues that dialogical solidarity by means of dialectic hermeneutics necessitates the “tacit assumption” of a transcendent good-beyond-being that, although it lies beyond the contextualized, historical norms that constitute the good-for-us, is also what ultimately makes these possible (pg. 116). In other words, in all understanding, including understanding the good-for-us, we must “proceed ‘as if’ there were a final end — though what that final end is can never be, finally, fully specified and nor can it be achieved” (pg. 120).

According to Barthold the dialectical ethics of hermeneutics avoids grounding ethics solely in our contingent and momentary norms, desires, beliefs and values while at the same time giving due weight to the fact that good-for-us is contextually and historically situated. Moreover, it helps us avoid the danger of falling into the total instrumentalization of life that is so vigorously critiqued by Arendt. Thus, in Barthold’s words,

The moral emerging from Gadamer’s dialectical hermeneutics is that humans have a peculiar task, namely, to live in-between the transcendent and immanent, between the universal and particular, between the diffuse and the concrete, and that to privilege one side over the other is to either elevate humans to the status of gods or to reduce humans to the status of automatons. Hermeneutics esteems the value of living in light of the transcendent, which, rather than being a hindrance to movement provides us with a call, the details of which it is our lifelong task to fill in. (pp. 124-125)

In other words, rather than grounding ethics in the self-sufficient, individual subject, Barthold argues that the understanding requisite for dialectical ethics “implies another: both an ‘immanent’ other with whom we struggle to hold hands and a ‘transcendent’ other for whom we reach but never grasp” (pg. 127). In this respect, Barthold’s book represents a welcome and important philosophical contribution to the discussion of the advantages dialectical ethics can provide to those working within the neo-pragmatic tradition.

However, as an interpretation of the ethical elements of Gadamer’s hermeneutics, I have my doubts about the adequacy of Barthold’s account. The focus of my concern will be on Barthold’s analysis of the role of the good in Gadamer’s thought. Indicative of some of my concerns is that throughout her analysis Barthold typically refers to the good-beyond-being as “transcendent.” In fleshing out what this means, Barthold invariably refers to the transcendence of the good-beyond-being in relation to the good-for-us, i.e., the good that lies beyond any concrete conception of the good-for-us. Yet at the same time she wishes more than this. Namely, she wants the good-beyond-being to transcend hermeneutic understanding in such a way that it provides both a necessary condition for the possibility of hermeneutic understanding and also a focal point according to which traditions and prejudices can be criticized. In this manner, she tries to argue that hermeneutic understanding is ethical. This comes out quite clearly in her critique of “those who hesitate to impute any sort of ethics to Gadamer,” for instance P. Christopher Smith and Rudolf Bernet (pg. 101). She quotes Smith as arguing that for Gadamer "ethical reasoning is interpretation." On the contrary, she wants to see interpretation as fundamentally ethical insofar as understanding is possible only in relation to the transcendent good-beyond-being.

Thus, at issue is the role that the good plays in Gadamer’s account of hermeneutics. In the penultimate chapter of her book she tries to argue that dialectical ethics and its transcendent good-beyond-being is essential to Gadamer’s account of hermeneutics and hermeneutical understanding. In what follows I want to raise questions about Barthold’s account. This first requires an examination of Barthold’s conception of the transcendent good-beyond-being.

Consistent with what I have previously mentioned about the neo-pragmatic orientation of Gadamer’s Dialectical Hermeneutics, Barthold gives a relatively straightforward pragmatic conception of the transcendent good-beyond-being. That is, she states that it is a “tacit assumption” of all dialogue that we must proceed “as if” there were a final end, namely, the transcendent good-beyond-being. She further remarks,

I take Gadamer to be making an anti-metaphysical realist point here by rejecting the good as an eidos. It is more like an ideal, something at which we aim yet is never fully achievable, than an “idea” that exists in and of itself. Here the words of William James prove illustrative: the good functions as an “ideal standard” that is regulatory in nature. (pg. 116)

No one should deny that Gadamer rejects the notion of the good as an eidos — he explicitly says as much, but that the good is to be understood as a pragmatic, regulative ideal, namely, as a “tacit assumption” that we must proceed “as if” it were the case, seems to demonstrate Smith’s point all the more. In other words, what differentiates the notion of the transcendent good-beyond-being as a “tacit assumption” from any other prejudice in Gadamer’s sense? And if it is a prejudice, even a particularly fundamental prejudice, it certainly does not transcend interpretation and hermeneutic understanding, at least according to Gadamer. Moreover, the fact that Barthold says that we proceed “as if” there were a transcendent good-beyond-being makes it seem even less like a historically-effective prejudice and more like an ahistorical, pragmatic principle of understanding.

More unfortunate still is that she ultimately turns to Rorty to explicate the manner in which the transcendent good-beyond-being can function in the way she hopes. She says,

Rorty esteems in the ideals of the Founding Fathers precisely the fact that progress can be made only when we are able to think beyond our parochial goals to something bigger than ourselves and which is not yet fully conceivable. As he himself admits, it is an intentionally vague ideal meant to spur people on to new ways of thinking and living. It is this notion, then, of a vague ideal that helps us make sense of a good-beyond-being. In fact, Plato’s exultation of the good sounds an awful lot like the “fuzziness” Rorty extols in another essay (pp. 123-124).

She goes on to argue

Gadamer’s dialectical hermeneutics, too, acknowledges that humans function best when aiming at diffuse goals, for this encourages us to transcend the limits of the moment. If we have only a specific goal, there is no room for creativity, risk, change, etc. — not to mention understanding. (pg. 124)

Put differently, the vagueness and diffuseness of the transcendent good-beyond-being — its “fuzziness” — make possible the “natality” of human understanding, i.e., its ability to give creative birth to new understandings (pp. 92-93). One is reminded here of Rorty’s analysis of Heidegger’s question of being. Rorty argues that the question of being is similar to the question “What is a cherry blossom?” insofar as neither advocates for a topic of inquiry, but each is simply designed to “direct our attention to the difference between inquiry and poetry, between struggling for power and accepting contingency.”1

This is not to suggest that the good does not play an essential role in Gadamer’s hermeneutics. It certainly does. Just not as the tacit assumption of a vague, diffuse and fuzzy notion that functions as a pragmatic regulative ideal for achieving dialogical solidarity while fostering creativity, risk, change, and understanding. Put differently, Barthold attempts to bring solidarity and natality to hermeneutic understanding by means of the tacit assumption of the notion of a transcendent good-beyond-being. It does so by being vague, diffuse and fuzzy thus allowing everyone to assume it tacitly without excluding any concrete conception of the good-for-us. Moreover, its vagueness spurs us on to give birth to new, creative understandings of the good-for-us.

This may be the result of an admirable attempt to embody the hermeneutic principle of application, in this case, applying Gadamer’s hermeneutics to the concerns of contemporary pragmatism, especially with regard to ethics, but it sacrifices the universality of hermeneutic understanding by suggesting that what ultimately makes hermeneutic understanding possible is a quite peculiar, pragmatically-inspired account of the transcendent good-beyond-being. On the contrary, and following Smith, I would suggest that Barthold’s “ethical reasoning is interpretation.” In other words, such a pragmatically-inspired account of the transcendent good-beyond-being and of a dialectical ethics is subject to hermeneutic understanding precisely because it relies on the tacit assumption, i.e., prejudice, that understanding requires that we proceed as if there were a final end that guides dialogical action for the sake of achieving solidarity and natality in our attempt to understand a vague, diffuse and fuzzy notion of a transcendent good-beyond-being.

Unfortunately, Barthold’s Rortyian-inspired reflections on the transcendent good-beyond-being are at odds with Gadamer’s account of the good. Gadamer remarks that "the problem that Plato’s mythical question about the good contains is the same one that Aristotle later singles out as the problem of analogy or the analoga entis."2 The mystery of the analogical unity of the good — and it is in this respect that it transcends any particular good, e.g., the good-for-us — is not solved by noting that the good itself is vague, diffuse, and fuzzy. For one, and as Gadamer notes, there is nothing that mediates between the good and what exists, rather "it appears in existence immediately."3 The peculiar nature of the good consists in the fact that while transcending any particular good it immediately appears in every particular good. It is hardly an adequate account of this to say that in any particular good a vague, diffuse and fuzzy transcendent good appears immediately, for the former is precisely a determination of the latter insofar as the vagueness, diffuseness and fuzziness of the latter is removed in order to get the former. Just in the way that Gadamer describes the good in relation to any particular good it appears to be at odds with Barthold’s account.

Curiously, whereas Aristotle criticized Plato for his reliance on a vague notion of participation to mediate between the eternal eidos and sensible reality, for Barthold it is precisely the relation of vagueness, diffuseness and fuzziness that mediates between the transcendent good-beyond-being and any particular good-for-us. Furthermore, for Barthold this mediation is further mediated by our giving creative birth in solidarity with others to the concrete good-for-us by grasping to understand what is essentially incapable of being understood, namely, the transcendent good-beyond-being, because it is vague, diffuse and fuzzy. Moreover, this simply reverses the traditional understanding of Plato’s conception of the eidos in relation to sensible reality. On that understanding, it is sensible reality that is a vague, diffuse and fuzzy instantiation of the eidos. But of course, this is precisely what one would expect if, like Rorty, one wanted to displace the traditional search for knowledge from understanding and replace it with creative productivity.

Gadamer, on the other hand, reads Plato quite differently. The transcendence of the good consists in the fact that it is the continuum, i.e., a unity of a manifold or a unity of difference, by which is measured better or worse, which in turn is the defining relationship that essentially characterizes and orders everything that is good. That is, anything good is good by essentially being better, not, as a traditional eidetic conception would have it, by being a particular instance of a conceptual generality, whether vague, diffuse and fuzzy or not.4 Thus, the good appears immediately in anything good analogous to the manner in which the continuum of the whole numbers immediately appears in any given whole number. Just to emphasize the difference, it is inappropriate to characterize a continuum as essentially vague, diffuse and fuzzy for if that were the case it could not provide the foundation for measure broadly construed. A continuum is a unity of determinable indeterminacy (e.g., the whole numbers), not something vague, diffuse and fuzzy. In fact, vagueness itself is a continuum that is not identical to the continuum of the good by which better and worse is measured.

This hopefully sets in relief the difference Gadamer wishes to draw between himself and Rorty on the issue at hand when he says

I would perhaps agree with him [Rorty] in that in our search for the good we will, at best, hit upon the better, never the good in itself. And yet … it’s also true that we will never search for or find what is better for us without seeking the good in itself or at least having it in mind.5

How is this connected to Gadamer’s larger concerns with hermeneutic understanding? Understanding, as well as traditions and prejudices, are for Gadamer essentially characterized by being better or worse, which is precisely why the epistemological notion of knowledge as right or wrong or true and false (in the traditional sense) does not begin to capture the notion of understanding, but is in fact a highly flattened and narrow version of understanding. This is also why Gadamer resists any attempt to criticize tradition and prejudices by means of a reflective regard that isolates a tradition or prejudice by objectifying it. Rather, for Gadamer critical understanding remains situated within the good as the continuum of better and worse precisely insofar as criticism involves determining whether or not something, in this case a tradition or prejudice, is better or worse than another or others. Additionally, this demonstrates why hermeneutic understanding requires that one is always already situated within a tradition and guided by prejudices, for a determination of better or worse always requires comparison. No tradition or prejudice can be critically understood in isolation.

Finally, one can see how inappropriate it is to characterize, as Barthold attempts to do, Gadamer’s notion of hermeneutic understanding primarily in terms of solidarity and creativity or natality. For creativity and natality are not essentially characterized by better or worse. For one can give birth to a creative monstrosity and that it is a monstrosity makes it no less creative. In this regard, it helps to think back to Aristotle’s distinction between the phronemos and the person who is merely clever. Neither does solidarity seem to have a direct connection to hermeneutic understanding. Better or worse understandings can equally engender solidarity. Or, put differently, that an understanding increases solidarity or does the opposite is not necessarily indicative of whether that understanding is a better or worse with regard to die Sache.

In conclusion, I think Barthold’s book is a wonderful exercise in neo-pragmatic practical philosophy and will provide those interested in it with many important insights. On top of this, and beyond Barthold’s larger project, many of the early chapters of her book contain valuable insights into aspects of Gadamer’s reading of Plato and Aristotle that have not been thoroughly investigated, especially the relation between dialectics and hermeneutics. However, I believe her attempt to read a dialectical ethics as she conceives this into Gadamer’s hermeneutics is ultimately unsuccessful.

1 Richard Rorty, Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2 (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1991), pg. 36.

2 Hans-Georg Gadamer, The Idea of the Good in Platonic-Aristotelian Philosophy, translated by P. Christopher Smith (New Haven and London: Yale UP, 1986), pg. 124.

3 Ibid.

4 Ibid., pp. 104-125.

5 Hans-Georg Gadamer, A Century of Philosophy: A Conversation with Riccardo Dottori, translated by Rod Coltman with Sigrid Koepke (New York and London: Continuum, 2003), pp. 42-43.