Gauging What's Real: The Conceptual Foundations of Gauge Theories

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Richard Healey, Gauging What's Real: The Conceptual Foundations of Gauge Theories, Oxford UP, 2007, 297pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199576937.

Reviewed by Ward Struyve, K.U. Leuven



Our current day most successful theories are gauge theories. On the one hand there are the quantized Yang-Mills theories that describe non-gravitational interactions. On the other hand there is general relativity (whose quantum version is still under construction) which describes gravitational interaction. These theories are called gauge theories because their standard formulation contains unobservable and hence apparently redundant elements. In the philosophical community, the gauge aspects of Yang-Mills theories have received far less attention then those of general relativity. Healey’s latest book — winner of the 2008 Lakatos award — is therefore remarkable in that its main focus is Yang-Mills theories. Most of this book concerns a careful and detailed study of the ontological implications of both classical and quantized Yang-Mills theories. In particular, a non-localized ontology is defended in which the basic ontological variables are the holonomies associated with loops in space-time.

In the first half of the book (the first four chapters), Healey considers classical gauge fields. In classical electromagnetism, the gauge field interacts with point-particles and a natural ontology is given by the point-particles and the electric and magnetic field. When the classical gauge field is instead coupled to a quantum particle (described by a wave function), a new effect arises, namely the Aharonov-Bohm effect, which seems to call for a revision of the classical ontology. Of course, by introducing a quantum particle one actually also needs to deal with the interpretational problems of standard quantum theory. Healey circumvents these problems by considering possible ontologies only for gauge fields, without much consideration for the ontology of the quantum particle. These interpretational issues are reconsidered in some detail in Chapter 8, in the context of quantized Yang-Mills theories, where they are unavoidable.

While it is definitely a good idea to disentangle gauge issues from interpretational issues, I believe that abstaining from fully incorporating the matter degrees of freedom in the ontology leads to other complications (as I will indicate below). I believe a better approach would have been to consider also a completely classical theory of interacting gauge fields with matter fields. For example, the matter field could be a Schrödinger field or a Klein-Gordon field. Such a theory would of course empirically be completely inadequate, just as classical non-Abelian Yang-Mills theories are, but I believe that a discussion of its hypothetical ontological implications would be just as instructive as Healey’s discussion of the latter theories. As with the classical non-Abelian Yang-Mills theories, one could assume that the hypothetical empirical content lies in the gauge invariant quantities. As such, there would also be an Aharanov-Bohm type effect (the “charge density” would obtain a fringe shift), so that much of Healey’s arguments would immediately carry over.

Healey considers three possible types of ontology for classical gauge fields (first for electromagnetism in Chapter 2, and then for general Yang-Mills theories in Chapter 4):

• “The no gauge potential properties view”: the ontology is given by the field strength (which Healey non-standardly calls the gauge field) and not by the gauge potential.

• “The localized gauge potential properties view”: the gauge potential makes up the ontology, or some other (yet to be determined) quantities that are associated to arbitrarily small neighbourhoods in space-time and that can be derived locally from the gauge potential.

• “The non-localized gauge potential properties view”: the quantities that make up the ontology can be derived from the gauge potential, but are not necessarily associated to arbitrarily small neighbourhoods in space-time.

Healey presents two arguments against the first view. First, this view implies action at a distance. This follows from the Aharonov-Bohm effect, where a magnetic field confined to a localized spatial region still has an effect on the interference pattern of a quantum particle that passes outside that region. Second, in the case of non-Abelian Yang-Mills theories, there exist gauge inequivalent gauge potentials that give rise to the same field strength in a simply connected region. So the field strength at that region would not completely capture the gauge invariant content associated to that region.

The second view is considered in more detail, with distinction of various approaches (including those of Leeds, Maudlin and Mattingly), but is finally rejected, basically on the ground of underdetermination: gauge equivalent potentials would yield different properties that can not be distinguished by observable facts.

After having rejected the first two possible views, Healey argues in favor of the third one. In particular, Healey defends a holonomy interpretation, whereby the ontology is given by the holonomies associated to loops (images of oriented closed curves) in space-time (these can be constructed from line integrals of the gauge potential along closed curves). While these quantities relate to extended regions of space-time, they do not imply non-local action. In the case of electromagnetism, which is an Abelian Yang-Mills theory, these holonomies are gauge independent. In the case of non-Abelian Yang-Mills theories, the holonomies are actually not entirely gauge invariant. Moreover, they also depend on the choice of base point on the loop. Healey seems to argue these issues away by noting that the quantities transform “covariantly” when also the wave function of the quantum system is taken into account.

It seems to me that, despite Healey’s apparent arguments to the contrary, the base-point dependence and the gauge dependence of the holonomies in the non-Abelian case may still lead to objections of the type Healey raised against the second view. Healey also considers the Wilson loop, which is just the trace of the holonomy, and which is completely gauge independent and independent of the choice of base point, but dismisses it on the ground that it doesn’t propertly take into account the interaction with the matter field. This is indeed a problem, but I don’t take the message of it to be that the Wilson loop should be rejected, but rather that its notion should be suitably extended to include matter fields. Healey actually describes just such an extension in Section 7.4 (in the context of loop quantization), where quantities are also associated to open paths. These are constructed from the holonomy along the path and fermion fields at the end points, and seem adequately to take into account the fermionic degrees of freedom. (Healey spends some time on the complications in constructing such quantities, but such constructions seem to arise naturally in the Weyl representation of the Dirac matrices; see for example [1] and references therein). Maybe including the matter degrees of freedom in this way leads to some complications for some interpretations of quantum theory, but they seem completely adequate in the context of a completely classical field theory. But that being said, the Wilson loop approach would have the same metaphysical implications as the holonomy approach. It would also yield a non-localized ontology that evolves in a local way.

By considering an ontology also for the quantum particle (or a classical matter field), it would also be clear how the holonomies act on the particle. As for now, Healey states that the holonomies do not act on hypothetical localized phase properties of the wave function, but rather on some yet to be determined non-localized phase properties along a loop (see for example p. 127). This account is not only a bit vague, it might also change for an ontology that properly takes into account the matter degrees of freedom (as seems to be the case for the generalized Wilson loop approach).

As Healey indicates in Section 3.1.2, the holonomies (as well as the Wilson loops) contain all the gauge invariant information contained in the gauge potential. This is an important kinematical result. If the hololomies are taken to be the basic quantities, one should also express their dynamics without reference to gauge potentials. Unfortunately this problem is not discussed by Healey.

It is also notable that in rejecting the second view, Healey does not appeal to the indeterminism that generally arises when taking the potential to represent physical reality. For example, the equations of motion for the gauge potential do not yield a unique solution given initial data, but rather a class of solutions that are all related by a gauge transformation. Since these solutions are observationally indistinguishable, there seems to be an unnecessary surplus structure. However, Healey does not appeal to this indeterminism of the equations of motion to reject the second view (although he mentions it in passing on p. 56), but rather to an underdetermination of another kind. This is illustrated by Healey’s discussion of Mattingly’s proposal of a priviledged vector potential, called the “current field”. This field can be expressed as a gauge invariant function of the charge current (which is itself gauge invariant). Since the current field is gauge invariant, there is deterministic evolution. I take Healey’s main argument against this proposal to be that other fields could have been chosen that would observationally be indistinguishable from the current field and would still satisfy all the desired properties. These other fields could be obtained from the current field by what merely looks formally like a gauge transformation. However, it is unclear to me how Healey’s holonomy interpretation (or a Wilson loop interpretation) could be shielded against a similar objection. One could always consider different non-localized ontologies that would observationally be indistinguishable from Healey’s ontology (though these would not relate to each other by what formally looks like a gauge transformation).

After having considered classical gauge fields, Healey devotes the second half of the book to their quantized counterparts. In Chapter 5, Healey first considers different routes to obtain a quantum theory from classical Yang-Mills theories. One approach that also should have consideredin this chapter, but wasn’t, is reduced phase space quantization. In this approach, which is briefly mentioned in Section 6.5, the gauge degrees of freedom are first eliminated, with the remaining degrees of freedom making up the reduced phase space, and then the theory is quantized. See, for example, [2] for some discussion of this approach.

In chapter 6, Healey considers the empirical import of gauge symmetry. In particular, some interesting features of quantized Yang-Mills theories are discussed, such as the Higgs mechanism, theta-vacua and anomalies, some of which still involve challenging conceptual questions.

Then, in Chapter 7, loop representations are considered, within the context of canonical quantization. In those representations the quantum states are functionals of loop variables (which are constructed in an overcomplete basis of Wilson loops). The virtue of these representations is that the gauge freedom is completely eliminated (just as in reduced phase space quantization). Healey considers the question of whether such representations might yield other quantum theories than the one that arises in the standard Fock representation. Different representations of the operator algebras might yield inequivalent quantum theories. This might allow the resulting quantum theories to be experimentally distinguished. And an experimental bias towards a theory that is obtained from a loop representation could support a loop based ontology within certain interpretations of quantum theory.

The various interpretations of quantum theory and their ontological implications for Yang-Mills theories are considered in Chapter 8. As Healey rightly notes, this is only an initial survey. Even though one can broadly distinguish the interpretations, such as Everettian or de Broglie-Bohm type intepretations, the ontological implications may still depend heavily on the details of the approach. For example, Everettian interpretations take the quantum state to represent the ontology, but there are various ways in which this quantum state can be understood: as just a state in a Hilbert space, or as a state in some preferred basis (for example in a loop representation), or as yielding states on space-time (see for example [3] for a discussion). Also in interpretations that have more ontology than just the quantum state, like de Broglie-Bohm theory or certain versions of collapse theories, there seem to be a variety of options. Some of these will incorporate an ontology that is similar to a possible ontology for classical Yang-Mills theories. For example, some might admit a holonomy interpretation. But one also has approaches where there is nothing like that. For example, in Bell’s de Broglie-Bohm-type model for lattice quantum field theory [4], the ontology in space-time is given by the “fermion numbers” on the lattice sites and there is nothing representing the gauge degrees of freedom.

To conclude, Healey’s book is a major achievement that will undoubtably serve as a valuable reference work as well as stimulate further debate and research. Healey intended the book to be self-contained, with extended appendices serving this goal. Nevertheless, some parts may be hard to follow without some background knowledge or without consultation of the original literature.


[1] T. Thiemann, Modern Canonical Quantum General Relativity, Cambridge UP, Cambridge (2007).

[2] J. Earman, “Tracking down gauge: an ode to the constrained Hamiltonian formalism”, in Symmetries in Physics: Philosophical Reflections, eds. K. Brading and E. Castellani, Cambridge UP, Cambridge (2003).

[3] D. Wallace and C. Timpson, “Quantum Mechanics on Spacetime I: Spacetime State Realism”, to appear in British Journal for the Philosophy of Science and arXiv:0907.5294.

[4] J.S. Bell, “Beables for quantum field theory”, CERN preprint CERN-TH. 4035/84 (1984), reprinted in J.S. Bell, Speakable and unspeakable in quantum mechanics, Cambridge UP, Cambridge, 173 (1987); Physics Reports 137, 49 (1986); in Quantum Implications, eds. B.J. Hiley and F. David Peat, Routledge, London, p. 227 (1987); in John S. Bell on The Foundations of Quantum Mechanics, eds. M. Bell, K. Gottfried and M. Veltman, World Scientific, Singapore, 159 (2001).