Gender in the Mirror: Cultural Imagery and Women's Agency

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Meyers, Diana Tietjens, Gender in the Mirror: Cultural Imagery and Women's Agency, Oxford University Press, 2002, 248pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195140419.

Reviewed by Louise Antony, Ohio State University


In Gender in the Mirror, Diana Tietjens Meyers argues that the pernicious gender imagery produced by patriarchal cultures has a profound and deleterious effect on women’s capacities for self-determination. Cultural “figurations” – visual images, metaphors, stories and myths – work insidiously to transmit gender norms. They “colonize” women’s psyches, impairing their powers of imagination, memory, introspection, and expression – all abilities that are essential elements of the repertoire of “agentic skills” that, on Meyers’s view, constitutes autonomy. An adequate feminist response to such imagery must seek not only to replace poisonous figurations of gender with more constructive ones, but in doing so, must take care to address the legitimate psychological needs that the malign imagery currently meet (albeit in ultimately harmful ways.) There is, in short, a powerful need for a “discursive politics” within feminism – a self-conscious strategy of creating and promulgating alternative, positive “refigurations” of gender identity and gender relations.

The book consists of seven chapters. The first chapter, “Gender Identity and Women’s Agency” is the most theoretical, laying out and defending Meyers’s conception of autonomy, and supporting her call for the development of positive feminist imagery. Chapters Two, Three, Four, and Six each deal with a specific subject of cultural figuration crucial to female identity: motherhood, community, family, and aging, respectively. Meyers attempts in each chapter both to show how currently prevalent figurations limit women’s abilities to conceive their own lives in positive and fulfilling ways, and to suggest replacement tropes and images that feminists might try to promulgate (or “broadcast”) as healthier alternatives. Chapter Five is an extended meditation on female narcissism and its connection to mirror imagery in art and myth. The chapter includes brief discussions of the work of five female artists who have subversively deployed such imagery to challenge cultural expectations about female beauty and self-regard. In the last chapter, “Live Ordnance in the Cultural Field,” Meyers examines two psychological theories of the origins of sexism. Meyers finds the theories implausible, and the programmes of social change they seem to entail badly inadequate. She reiterates and amplifies her own prognosis: given the potency of patriarchal representations of gender, sexism will never be defeated without a political strategy that replaces these with equally compelling images of equitable and sustaining gender relationships.

Despite some interesting observations and discussions, the book is disappointing overall. Meyers raises a number of very important conceptual issues, but does not take us far toward resolving them. Furthermore, her main positive theses involve strong empirical assumptions that she does little to support.

In her first chapter, Meyers pinpoints what is, to my mind, the most compelling problem facing feminist theorists today. This is the question of how to conceptualize “autonomy” once it has been acknowledged that a desire is not inauthentic just because it is socially produced. Feminist philosophers and political theorists have joined forces with many traditional epistemologists and ethicists in emphasizing the critical role that social relations play in the normal development of the human animal. However useful an idealization the socially indifferent, atomistic “individual” may be for certain theoretical purposes, the idealization misleads if it makes us think that we can come to understand such complex phenomena as the emergence of character or the structure of motivation without attention to the social relationships within which human beings necessarily develop. But if the shaping influence of these relationships is part of normal human development, then it becomes impossible to think of “autonomy” and “authenticity” in terms of a contrast between endogenously determined characteristics of some pre-social self on the one hand, and traits imposed by an external culture on the other. The natural/social distinction erodes when sociality is part of the nature of the beast.

Still, there seems to be a normatively significant distinction to be drawn among desires, values, motivations, and the like, and for this purpose, imagery of “inner” and “outer” is hard to avoid. Gender identity – one’s sense of oneself as a woman or as a man – is obviously shaped strongly by the culture in which one is raised. If the culture is sexist (and whose isn’t?) then the acquisition of a feminine identity may well involve the development of characteristics, interests, and desires that are culturally normative for women, or, more generally, the “internalization” of gender norms. Many feminists, including Meyers want to say that this process is damaging to women – but in what does the damage consist? We cannot cite the mere fact that feminine gender identity is socially produced – so would be any identity. An alternative that avoids appeal to an inner/outer contrast would be to characterize the “autonomous” agent in terms of a positive, substantive ideal of human flourishing, and then criticize sexist enculturation as a process that inhibits women’s progress toward autonomy. But there are two drawbacks to this strategy: First, it’s unclear where the requisite notion of human flourishing is going to come from. The dangers of enshrining some culturally specific conception of the person – indeed, a sexist conception – have been well documented by students of human difference. Second, insofar as actually existing women have been engendered within sexist societies, they will turn out, on this conception, to be less than autonomous. Many feminists object to this consequence, on the grounds that it makes women appear passive and lacking in responsibility for their actions and choices.

Meyers surveys feminist efforts to confront this dilemma and finds them all wanting. (Given the difficulty of the problem, this is not surprising.) She sees feminist theories of autonomy as falling into one of three categories: “latitudinarian, value-neutral” theories, “value-saturated” theories, and “feminist voice” theories. The first correspond roughly to what I’ve described as the “inner/outer” approach to autonomy: relying on very thin notions of the self, they call a choice, action or desire “autonomous” if it issues, in some to-be-specified way, from that self. Such theories typically proceed by specifying formal or structural conditions on autonomous choice – say, by requiring that a choice be reflectively endorsed – but say nothing about the substance of the choices made, or the reasons why the endorsement is forthcoming. Meyers rejects these theories, she says, because they do not provide a basis for any critical scrutiny of the choices or the endorsement. The second group of theories put substantive conditions on the desires and choices that can count as “authentic”, distinguishing these from merely apparent or “spurious” desires. Meyers is not persuaded either that theories of this type draw the distinction in the right place, or that the basis for the distinction can be adequately defended. It is the third group of theories, Meyers concludes, that come closest to giving us what we want. It was not clear why Meyers thinks these “feminist voice” accounts provide more than metaphorical renderings of one or the other of the alternatives she has already rejected: such theories speak of “articulating one’s own experience” “in one’s own way,” all of which sounds very like reflective endorsement. At any rate, Meyers does note that the familiar dilemma arises for voice theories, in the form of the problem of identifying the “authentic” voice:

it is necessary to distinguish when women are speaking in their own voices and when they are lip syncing [sic] the ominous baritone of patriarchy. [p. 18]

Oddly, Meyers begins at this point to call the problem “epistemological,” [p. 19] as if it were clear what conditions a voice must satisfy in order to be authentic, and it remained only to discover a way of telling when the conditions obtained. But having re-classified the problem, she dispatches it with alacrity. What’s needed to provide “feminist voice theory with a credible epistemology” is

to articulate an implicit theory of autonomy. A theory of how one can differentiate one’s own desires, values, and goals from the clamor of subordinating discourses and overwhelming social demands and how one can articulate and enact one’s own desires, values, and goals is a theory of self-determination. [p. 20]

To fill this bill, Meyers offers an account of autonomy as the possession of “well-developed, well-coordinated repertoires of agentic skills.” The abilities that compose these repertoires include: introspection, communication, memory, imagination, reasoning, self-nurturing, skills, “volitional” skills, and “interpersonal skills.”

Sympathetic as I am to Meyers’s approach, I don’t see that her specific proposal takes us very far in solving the dilemma. If we look just at the list of “agentic skills” that flesh out Meyers’s account, her view looks very similar to the value-neutral theories that she says she finds inadequate. The problem with such views, recall, was that they could not ground any account of internalized oppression – they could not identify as “inauthentic” the sorts of desires and values that might result from a woman’s having accepted a sexist message that she is or ought to be a certain way. But the only way that Meyers can provide this grounding is to – gratuitously – build substantive requirements of one sort or another into the possession conditions for the various agentic skills, and then the account looks very like one of the “value-laden” approaches. Consider, for example, the kind of “communication skills” Meyers puts on her list:

Communication skills that enable individuals to get the benefit of others’ perceptions, background knowledge, insights, advice, and support.

Terms like “perception,” “background knowledge” and “insights” have stricter and looser senses. Strictly speaking, they are success terms: you cannot perceive what is not there, nor can you know or have insight into falsehood. If we may assume that sexist assumptions are false, then such assumptions cannot be part of anyone’s “background knowledge,” and so the possession of Meyers’s “communication skills” will ensure that one does not soak up sexist messages. But no one has the “skill” to believe only those things that are true, or to trust only those people who are reliable. In the ordinary sense of “communicate,” one can be a fabulous communicator, and still acquire – by listening to and believing the wrong people – a wealth of misinformation.

One item on Meyers’s list will certainly give the right results, but only because it is circular, presupposing the very distinction we are trying to explicate:

Volitional skills that enable individuals to resist pressure to capitulate to convention and enable them to maintain their commitment to the self-portrait and to the continuations of their autobiographies that they consider genuinely their own.

If we knew the difference between “pressure” to conform and positive social influence, or the difference between rational accommodation and “capitulation,” we’d be home free. The problem we’re grappling with only exists because we’re prepared to acknowledge that there is no purely formal way to distinguish pernicious social influences from benign ones. One might try to rule out as “pressure” at least some kinds of social influence in the way that Habermas does, by requiring of a well-organized culture that there be no force except the “force of good reasons.” But this is not a strategy open to Meyers. She is adamant on two points: one, that cultural figurations operate by sub- or pre-rational mechanisms, and two, that this mode of influence is a necessary part of human psycho-social development, and thus perfectly legitimate in itself. She cannot – and does not want to – say that sexist imagery is detrimental to autonomy because of the way in which it carries its message. Otherwise, there would be no sense in her call for the development of replacement imagery. Clearly it’s the content and not the mediums of these messages that she deplores. But that means that she is going to have a more than usually difficult time reconstructing the needed distinctions. In the end, her account is left oscillating between one that sounds value-neutral and one that is in fact drenched in feminist values.

After this first chapter Meyers’s focus shifts to the sexist figurations themselves: what they are like and what to do about them. Although I happen to agree with Meyers’s readings of the current culture (in the U.S. in the beginning of the 21st century), there’s little here to persuade the skeptic. One expects, in these middle chapters, lots of references to literature, pop music, movies, advertisements, visual art, and so forth, but there are virtually none. Meyers similarly asserts without evidence that these figurations are immensely powerful in sustaining sexist social structures, and without considering the possibility that they are largely epiphenomenal, expressing but not causing an underlying material reality. But the most serious empirical question she begs concerns the relative efficacy of strategies for social change. Arguing for the necessity of a discursive politics, Meyers badly overstates her case, arguing that strategies that attack other presumed causes of sexism will all be ineffective. It won’t work to try to persuade people of the falsity of sexist stereotypes, for example, because rational discourse is impotent in competition with the unspoken messages of sexist figurations. And the sorts of reforms in family structure advocated by feminist psychoanalytical theorists are

not economically feasible for most cohabiting heterosexual parents, nor is it likely that the work world will be reorganized to accommodate shared parenting in the foreseeable future. [p. 183]

But if all this is true, why think that anything can be done about sexism at all? Indeed, if the power of cultural figurations is as great as Meyers makes it out to be, there’s little reason to think that Meyers’s own programme stands a chance either.

In general, Meyers’s practical proposals show little of the wisdom and insight evident in her provocative analyses of patriarchal imagery. Her critique of “pronatalist” discourse – imagery that expresses and promotes a normative identification of femininity with maternity – is incisive and courageous. This “matrigyno-idolatry” (I regret the ugly neologism) stigmatizes as not “really” female women who are not mothers, while generating unhealthy norms and expectations for those who are. Meyers suggests that we refigure the parenting relation by replacing images of merger and self-sacrifice with images that emphasize playful and mutual engagement between parent and offspring – fine, but how do we get these replacement images out there in the high schools and the malls, where they can do their work? In general, Meyers tells us surprisingly little about how sexist imagery becomes hegemonic – but until we know why, how, and by whom the projection of sexist figurations occurs, it’s idle to urge feminists to imagine new ones. Merely creating progressive imagery does no good unless it can also be “broadcast.” But broadcasting requires more than circulation among likeminded individuals; it may well require cooperation from the very corners where one can expect the most strenuous resistance – those with an interest in retaining and promoting the old images.

This neglect of material forces sometimes flaws even the analyses. When she discusses physical appearance and aging, Meyers speculates that the particular terror that afflicts women, as opposed to men, about the loss of youthful beauty is the result of a special association of the feminine with mortality, connected with the special association of women with birth and other processes of nature. Strikingly, she takes no account of the fact that a woman’s physical appearance is, to a large extent, her chief currency for obtaining social security in a patriarchal world. In that case, a woman’s preoccupation with prevailing standards of physical beauty can be seen as largely rational, and hardly touched by the sorts of expedients Meyers recommends, like mounting pictures of admirable elderly women around our homes.

Meyers’s discussion of the dominant bargaining-and-contract imagery of contemporary political theory adds some interesting twists to a familiar feminist critique. I found intriguing her connecting the “family romance” trope of psychoanalytic theory with the controversy surrounding recovered memory, but I wish she had been more careful in sorting evidence from speculation, and clearer about whether, where, and when facts matter. The chapter on beauty and narcissism seemed unfocused to me, and I found some of the interpretations of paintings idiosyncratic and strained.

Despite my criticisms, I found much to admire in this book. As a cultural critic, Meyers has a singular and fascinating sensibility, much in evidence in this work.