Genealogy of the Tragic: Greek Tragedy and German Philosophy

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Joshua Billings, Genealogy of the Tragic: Greek Tragedy and German Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2014, 258pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691159232.

Reviewed by Martin Thibodeau, Saint-Paul University


It is well known that the publication of Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment in 1790 sparked intense debates among German philosophers and intellectuals, which gave birth to what would later be referred to as German Idealism or post-Kantian idealist philosophy. Those debates, which included authors such as Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling, Schiller, Hölderlin, and Hegel, revolved around the exact significance of Kant's self-proclaimed philosophical revolution. Equally central to these authors was the important role Kant gave to the notion of freedom within his philosophical system. In their view, Kant's notion of metaphysical and moral freedom reflected the "real" and "concrete" freedom that seemed to be playing itself out on the stage of the most extraordinary political event the Western world had ever seen: the French Revolution.

From these debates concerning Kant's philosophical and France's political revolutions, some of the above-mentioned authors were drawn to reexamine Ancient Greece with particular attention to ancient Greek tragedy. Joshua Billings' book explores just this, and offers a remarkably well-documented study of one of the most intriguing trains of thought in the development of late 18th century and early 19th century post-Kantian German philosophy. Certainly, Billings' book is not the only recently published study to examine ancient Greek tragedy among post-Kantian German philosophers.[1] It is, however, distinct from other like publications on two interrelated points. First of all, it was not primarily intended to contribute to the study of German Idealism or post-Kantian philosophy, but rather to the fields of classical and literary studies. Secondly, unlike other publications that focus on the milestones of the philosophical readings of tragedy, from Plato and Aristotle to Schelling, Hegel, Nietzsche, and others, Billings addresses the post-Kantian interest in Greek tragedy by examining how it developed within the field of literary thought in France and Germany from the late 17th century onward. As a result, Billings' ambitious study offers an account of canonical interpretations of Greek tragedy proposed by German post-Kantian writers and philosophers, preceded by a detailed analysis of the all-too-often neglected historical literary background. The influence of this background on issues informing those interpretations cannot be denied, as it can be traced back to the famous Querelle des Anciens et des Modernes in late 17th century France.

Before examining central tenets of Billings' approach, the essential elements of his central argument must be understood. The book is divided into three major sections. In the first part (chapters one and two), Billings revisits what he sees as the key historical moments that shaped the issues around which German post-Kantian writers and philosophers developed their interpretations of Greek tragedy. He traces this process back to the opposition within the Académie française at the end of the 17th century between those who claimed ancient poetry was superior to modern literature and those who defended the converse view. As Billings notices, tragic poetry was not initially at the heart of this dispute, but quickly became a major issue of this evaluative comparison between Antiquity and Modernity. Newly published translations of Sophocles and Euripides, as well as Aristotle's Poetics, contributed to debates about the value of ancient tragedies versus the tragedies of Racine, Corneille, Shakespeare and others. In addition, as the Querelle evolved, opposing views became increasingly nuanced. By the end of the 18th century, advocating for the superiority of one era over the other would be replaced by the recognition of different eras' specificities, differences and similarities, which came to be known as historicization.

In Billings' view, Johann Gottfried Herder's essay, "Shakespeare" (1773), represented an important step in this shift toward historicization. Herder rejected the notion that Aristotelian poetics were applicable to modern literature, and argued against any comparison between ancient and modern tragedy, between Sophocles and Shakespeare. By the same token, however, Herder also advocated for preserving a principle that would enable one to evaluate Sophocles' and Shakespeare's works in relation to their respective historical circumstances. This principle pointed toward something like a "kernel" or an "essence" of tragedy -- the "tragic" -- which was once expressed in Antiquity, and which allowed for a correspondence between Sophocles and Shakespeare, between ancient and modern tragedy, and by extension, between the ancient world and the modern world, reaching beyond their differences.

According to Billings, such a historicized understanding of tragedy would become central to discussions among the above-mentioned German post-Kantian philosophers and writers. In Billings' own words, "the importance of tragedy for the idealists lies in its simultaneous distance and closeness, as an ancient representation of central problems of modern existence" (76). Thus, in the second section (chapters three to five), Billings draws on several essays by Schiller, the young Schelling, the young Hegel, as well as the Schlegel brothers, and Hölderlin, to demonstrate how these authors viewed the main relevance of tragedy, and especially ancient Greek tragedy, as providing an ideal model for understanding the profound ethical and political problems of modern times. According to these authors, Greek tragedies such as Sophocles' Oedipus Tyrannus and Antigone represented a view of freedom very much in tune with what was being sought after in modern times. In addition, these authors argued that the tragic view of freedom is best understood in connection with Kant's view of freedom expressed in his Critique of the Power of Judgment. That view, they believed, provided a compelling alternative to the notion of freedom Kant had previously outlined in his moral philosophy. They stated that in his third Critique Kant did not conceive of freedom as an unknowable, supersensible "entity" distinct from and opposed to empirical reality. Instead, as he was spelling out the different facets of what he called reflective judgment, he was led to define the terms of a type of experience -- aesthetic and teleological -- in which subject and object, the intelligible and the sensible, the infinite and the finite, reason and understanding, liberty and necessity are thought of in their togetherness.

Particularly illuminating in this respect is the twenty-year-old Schelling's Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism (1795), which can be considered the very first attempt to explicitly connect ancient Greek tragedy to issues that are at the heart o f post-Kantian, idealist debates. Indeed, in Letters, Schelling presents his understanding of the fundamental philosophical conflict of modern times, expressed for him in what Kant designated as the third antinomy of reason in Critique of Pure Reason. Schelling holds that this conflict is comprised of two opposing views: on the one hand what Kant labeled "dogmatism", which he, himself, believed to be best represented by Spinoza's philosophy, and which he understands as the system of absolute objectivity or necessity; and on the other, criticism which, according to Schelling is best conveyed through Fichte's Doctrine of Science and which he describes as the system of absolute subjectivity and freedom. Schelling claims, however, that this conflict is impossible to resolve since each philosophical system represents only one part of the equation, and thus fails to capture the real and adequate absolute, i.e., the underlying originary unity or identity of both necessity and freedom. Yet, in Schelling's view, this unity was once expressed or represented by Greek tragic art since it brought on stage both what was to become the third antinomy of modern reason and the solution to this antinomy. In other words, Greek tragedy provided the key to the solution to the antinomy at the origin of the problems and aporias of both dogmatic metaphysics and the system of transcendental idealism in its Fichtean reformulation.

Finally, Billings devotes the last section (chapters six and seven) to what he contends are two seminal contributions to the post-Kantian reflection on Greek tragedy: Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (1807) and Hölderlin's Sophocles: Oedipus and Antigone (1804). Admittedly, those works differ profoundly with respect to their magnitude, their scope, and their overarching intentions and approach to Greek tragedy. As is well known, the Phenomenology of Spirit unfolds as a long and detailed argument that deals with an unusual number of issues, e.g., knowledge, truth, ethics, politics, religion, history, the Greek polis, and the French Revolution. In the course of this notoriously complex argument, Hegel addresses the topic of tragedy in the section devoted to what he calls "the ethical order" (Sittlichkeit) and in the chapter entitled "Religion". By contrast, Hölderlin's "Notes" (Anmerkungen) to Oedipus and Antigone form a significantly shorter body of work essentially meant to provide an explanatory comment to Hölderlin's own translations of Sophocles' plays. Billings holds, nevertheless, that both Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit and Hölderlin's "Notes" take the connection between post-Kantian philosophy and ancient tragedy one step further. In their own ways, both Hegel and Hölderlin "pursue substantially more complex approaches" (163) by which tragedy is viewed as a "model" or a "figure" for the understanding of temporality, historicity or of history as such. In Billings' words: "Tragedy is a figure for understanding historicity: How is it that moderns could experience the world so differently from the Greeks, and what losses and gains has historical changes brought?" (163). This, Billings argues, is the fundamental legacy of Hegel's and Höderlin's later inquiries into tragedy, a legacy that has certainly been pursued by some of the great minds of the 19th and 20th centuries, but which "still has a great deal to teach us" (163).

As I've already mentioned, Billings offers an ambitious, exceptionally well-documented and comprehensive study, examining most of the major works on the topic since the late 17th century Querelle des Anciens et des Modernes to the early 19th century German post-Kantian engagement with tragedy. In addition, he considers most of the recent related secondary literature published in English, German and French. In this regard, Billings' book is  remarkable, and will, without a doubt, prove to be a valuable resource for anyone interested in the topic. Unfortunately, I believe that the book also suffers from its comprehensiveness and extensiveness. Specifically, in its 230-odd pages, it addresses an impressive number of writings, many of which are challengingly difficult, profoundly ambiguous, and have received different and even contradictory interpretations. Billings certainly provides very clear and in some cases illuminating readings of those oftentimes daunting texts. But, most probably due to space limitations, he more often than not merely describes and briefly explains their main theses, referring to commentators who tackle their ambiguities and opacities in relatively short footnotes. As a result, Billings' readings often appear as a series of summaries lacking the profound analysis and careful scrutiny that would enable them to be considered significant or major contributions to the understanding of the texts.

My second concern regards Billings' overall approach, which combines Dieter Henrich's method of "constellation research" (Konstellationsforschung) and Michel Foucault's Nietzsche-inspired "genealogical" methodology. Such an approach, Billings claims, allows one to "illuminate connections and continuities that previous scholars have neglected, and gives broader definition to a formative intellectual moment that is often studied atomistically" (6). In this regard, I agree with him that the post-Kantian mode of inquiry into tragedy is marked by a profound underlying continuity, which can ultimately be traced back to the legacy of Aristotle's Poetics. I also agree with Billings' critique of Peter Szondi, who once held that "Since Aristotle, there has been a poetics of tragedy. Only since Schelling has there been a philosophy of the tragic" (8). I find that Billings has reason to argue that Szondi both misses the underlying continuity between ancient and modern engagement with tragedy, and misrepresents the real shift, which indeed occurred as German post-Kantian philosophers undertook their investigation of ancient tragedy at the turn of the 19th century. However, I believe that Billings misses the point as he describes the specifics of this shift. Certainly, he can argue that the interest in ancient Greek tragedy among German, post-Kantian idealists thinkers is connected to their views on Kant's philosophical revolution. He also gets it right as he describes how post-Kantian philosophers and writers read ancient tragedies through the lens of Kantian notions defined in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. These include notions such as sublimity, genius, as well as others that Kant characterizes as different aspects of aesthetic experience.

As accurate as those descriptions may be, I do not find that they capture what is fundamentally at stake in the readings by those post-Kantian thinkers who connect their interpretations of ancient Greek tragedy to their understanding of what they believed was the meaning of Kant's philosophical system as a whole and Kant's third Critique in particular. If not absent, such a connection is, at the very least, insufficiently treated in Billings' study. This insufficiency is unfortunate because this connection provides nothing but the fundamental motives for the post-Kantian engagement with tragic art and poetry. In my view, such connection may be described in this way: for Schelling, Hegel, Hölderlin and others, Kant's tripartite system was to be considered the philosophical expression of what sociologists would come to call the differentiated network of modern reason made possible by the process of the "disenchantment" of the world. As Jürgen Habermas has emphasized, the tripartite division of the Kantian system -- into theoretical, practical and aesthetic reason -- is the philosophical expression of what would find its institutional existence in the modern sciences, in autonomous art and art criticism, and, finally, in the constitution of modern forms of law distinct from questions relating to morality. For Habermas and many others, the formal differentiation of the spheres of rationality represents the achievement of enlightened modernity. By contrast, according to Schiller, Schelling, Hegel, and Hölderlin, this differentiation constitutes the problem of the modern world. In Hegel's words, such differentiation represents what he calls the "diremptions" (Entzweiungen) of modern reason.

However, for each of these post-Kantian thinkers, Kant's philosophical system conveyed the solution to its own problem, and this solution, they claimed, was precisely presented in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. In their view, the key features of the third Critique (e.g., Kant's characterization of reflective judgment as well as the notions of sublime, genius, and the aesthetic Ideas) were the notions by which the modern world would be able to generate anew the unity of its reason. However -- and this is the extent of the problem faced by those post-Kantian thinkers -- the notions or concepts that would provide the solution to the diremptions of modern reason were to be found in a work dedicated to a type of experience and of judgment that, in the modern world, does not express any truth (either theoretically or practically), but which is merely qualified as aesthetic and teleological. Nevertheless, for Schelling, Hegel and Hölderlin, it is none other than this understanding of reason that needed, so to speak, to be recuperated and retrieved from its aesthetic exclusion. This conception of reason, which they would come to characterize as speculative reason, was the one that would be capable of reunifying, in new terms, the system of modern reason. And it is only on the basis of this reunified system of reason, they argued, that the aspirations of the times, i.e., the political project of emancipation and freedom would be realizable. In short, it is this understanding of reason that the young Schelling, Hegel and Hölderlin claimed was outlined in Kant's third Critique and which, they believed, had once been represented in ancient Greek tragedies.[2]

These two objections aside, Billings has written a compelling book that will surely be of great interest to those wanting to explore a topic and a series of texts that are as fascinating as they are challenging.

[1] Amongst the works on this topic published in the last decades, J. Taminiaux, Le théâtre des philosophes. La tragédie, l'être, l'action, Grenoble: Jérôme Million, 1995; C. Menke, Tragödie im Sittlichen. Gerechtigkeit, und Freiheit nach Hegel, Frankfurt/Main: Suhrkamp, 1996; D. Schmidt, On Germans and Other Greeks. Tragedy and Ethical Life, Bloomington/Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2001; M. Thibodeau, Hegel et la tragédie grecque, Rennes: Presses Universitaires de Rennes, 2011.

[2] I performed such a reading in Hegel et la tragédie grecque, Rennes: Presses Universitaires de Rennes, 2011. For a similar reading, but which expands to "aesthetics" in general and is more concerned with 20th century European philosophers, see J. M. Bernstein, The Fate of Art. Aesthetic Alienation from Kant to Adorno and Derrida, University Park: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1992.