Genes: A Philosophical Inquiry

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Graham, Gordon, Genes: A Philosophical Inquiry, Routledge, 2002, 196pp, $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 041525258X.

Reviewed by Jonathan Michael Kaplan, University of Tennessee


Genes: A Philosophical Inquiry, is at its best when Gordon Graham focuses his attention on aspects of the contemporary debates surrounding biotechnology that purport to have an ethical dimension. Here, in the second half of the book, Graham presents a series of compelling arguments to the effect that, for the most part, the ethical issues engendered by new advances in biotechnology (e.g., genetic engineering, adult mammalian cloning) are not different in kind from those issues engendered by more ’traditional’ biological technologies (e.g., ’ordinary’ plant and animal breeding, assisted reproductive technologies, etc.). However, Graham’s apparent lack of familiarity with the relevant literature and lack of experience with biology more generally results in his arguments being weaker and less well developed than they need be, and the lack of references to those people that have made these or similar arguments before (and, in many cases, made them better) is frustrating.

In the first part of the book, where Graham’s arguments depend on the details of biological cases, his apparent inexperience with the literature, and with biology more generally, is deeply problematic. Indeed, the number of straightforward factual errors in Genes gives the unfortunate impression that Graham’s understanding of the current state of evolutionary biology, genetic research, the philosophy of biology, and even bioethics, are all fairly weak. However unfair, it is hard to take seriously someone whose knowledge of the current state of the fields at issue comes across as so poor. Graham seems blithely unaware of the status of important hypotheses, important technologies, and important conceptual debates within and between these arenas. For example, for at least the past decade, no one has seriously supposed that it was “a long series of volcanic explosions” that wiped out the dinosaurs (48) rather than an asteroid or comet impact. The idea that humans evolved “independently in Australasia” and Africa (75) is likewise now pretty much dead in the water, and has been for at least five years (and was on pretty shaky ground before that). The idea that “the ultimate survivors” in Darwinian evolution are genes (80) does not represent anything like a consensus (or even majority) view in contemporary evolutionary biology. That the origination of life on Earth began 2.4 b.y.a (63) is far afield from the figure of 3.5 b.y.a.. supported by current evidence. Likewise, Graham is apparently unfamiliar with biochip technology (his arguments on page 99 depend on biochips not existing), with the genetics of human eye color (he claims on page 52 that it is determined by a single gene, which is known not to be true even of the blue/brown case), or with genetics more generally (at one point, on page 112, he seems to be claiming that selective abortion to eliminate recessive genes is impossible because “50% of the population are heterozygotes” when of course the degree of heterozygocity of a particular locus in a particular population is an empirical question).

The book’s references are remarkable for what is left out as much for what is included. There are, for example, six of Richard Dawkins’ works referenced, but no references to works by his late arch-rival, Stephen J. Gould (who is only mentioned once in the text, and then in passing). There is an extended discussion of the limits of the so-called ’neo-Darwinian Synthesis,’ but no mention of Richard Lewontin, who is certainly one of the most important, if not the most important, evolutionary biologist to explore those limits in a rigorous and responsible fashion. Indeed, Graham’s understanding of contemporary evolutionary biology seems to have been gleaned primarily from reading Dennett’s Darwin’s Dangerous Idea and Richard Dawkins’ popular works. Whatever one thinks of the value of Dennett’s book, neither it nor Dawkins’ works can substitute for the more technical introductions to evolutionary biology available, to which no references are made (Douglas Futuyma’s classic Evolutionary Biology, now in its third edition, provides a very even-handed introduction to the field, and a quick perusal of it would have prevented many of Graham’s more embarrassing blunders). There are no references to any works by such important names in the philosophy of biology as Eliot Sober, Kim Sterelny, Susan Oyama, Paul Griffiths, etc., and, even when works by such important players as Philip Kitcher and Michael Ruse are mentioned, it is in each case only one popular book that is cited.

The second chapter, “Genetic Explanation,” is the longest, and in many ways the most problematic, chapter in Genes. It is not that there is much in his conclusions to disagree with –the basic claim of the chapter seems to be that it is impossible to adequately explain all the features of individual organisms (and the living world) only by reference to their genes or to the details of their particular evolutionary history. This is utterly uncontroversial, despite the sometimes injudicious language of authors like Dawkins. The difficulties lie not with the conclusions, but with how those conclusions are argued for, and what the conclusions are taken to imply.

For example, in discussing the possible limitations of what Graham calls “Darwinism” he first confronts creationist and neo-creationist arguments. Graham’s attack on creationism is sound (if unoriginal) and his discussion of the difficulties with Behe’s use of the concept of ’irreducible complexity’ in the case of sophisticated organismal biochemical pathways is at least adequate–Graham correctly notes that neither of these represent a real threat to contemporary evolutionary biology. But what is disturbing is that Graham then goes on to support Behe’s contention that the ’origins of life’ are one arena where so far evolutionary biology has had relatively little to say – a fact, claims Graham, that reveals a real limitation of “Darwinism.” This claim demonstrates something of a category mistake on Graham’s part. The ’origin of life’ question is not, despite the protestations of Behe and the more traditional creationists to the contrary, properly part of evolutionary biology at all. It is a problem for physical chemistry, and, while if it is solved its solution will undoubtedly utilize insights from biochemistry, it is emphatically not, nor could it be, a question about the evolution of living things. The ’failure’ of “Darwinism” to provide an adequate solution to the problem of how life originated is no more serious than its ’failure’ to provide an adequate explanation for the physico-chemical properties of water. While explanations of both are required to fully explain the living world, neither is properly speaking part of the domain of biology (and still less of evolutionary biology).

Likewise, Graham takes the evidential and conceptual difficulties with ’Evolutionary Psychology’ (EP) to be a serious problem for what he calls “Darwinism.” Now, if “Darwinism” is meant to refer to contemporary evolutionary biology, Graham’s claim is simply false, as some of the harshest criticisms of EP have come from practicing evolutionary biologists themselves, many of whom regard the practitioners of EP to be dilettantes of the worst sort (see Pigliucci and Kaplan 2002 and cites therein). Graham rehashes a subset of the standard criticisms of EP and concludes (quite rightly) that so far EP has not shown itself capable of providing the sorts of explanations for particular behaviors or behavioral tendencies that its practitioners wish to provide. But is this a problem for “Darwinism”? I can’t see that it is. The existence of phenotypic plasticity – the ability of a particular developmental system to take on different phenotypes in response to different environmental cues – implies that often what is required is not an explanation of a particular phenotype, but rather an explanation of the evolution of a range of possible outcomes. Further, evolutionary theory is not committed to the view that everything an organism does it was selected to do; rather, some traits can be co-opted for other uses (see Gould and Lewontin 1979). An evolutionary explanation of the range of behaviors we are capable of performing given a particular developmental context would be a successful explanation of the first order, in just the same way as explaining, e.g., the range of the flowering times for a particular genotype of Arabidopsis given particular developmental conditions is a success of the first order (see Pigliucci 2002 for discussion). Now, if Lewontin is right, we may never be able to adequately explain even why we evolved brains capable of the sorts of complex tasks they are capable of, since the information needed to test competing hypotheses may well be lost to time (Lewontin 1998). But again, our inability to discover every detail of what actually transpired in the development of life on earth is not and cannot count as a failure of ’evolutionary biology,’ no more than our inability to discover every detail of what actually transpired in Napoleon’s march across Europe is a failure of the more traditional historical enterprises.

Now, perhaps these criticisms of Graham are unfair; perhaps in criticizing “Darwinism” Graham has something much more specific in mind than contemporary evolutionary biology. But if so, Graham owes the reader a clearer picture of what “Darwinism” is and how it fits into contemporary evolutionary biology, as evolutionary biology is understood by practicing evolutionary biologists (including those who are acknowledged to be leaders in the field). But again, Graham not only fails to provide us with such an overview, he provides us with no discussion of, or references to, the work of any contemporary practicing evolutionary biologists at all: Dennett and Pinker are not evolutionary biologists, and neither Dawkins nor Wilson are practicing evolutionary biologists any more (rather, they are both now primarily popularizers, etc.).

These problems, though, remain mostly internal to Chapter 2, as all Graham needs for the arguments he develops in the second half of the book is the uncontroversial claim that our (and all other organisms’) development is not deterministic, simply the unfolding of some simple genetic program. In Chapters 3 and 4 (“Genetic Engineering” and “Playing God”), Graham focuses on the ethical issues that are supposed to emerge from those biotechnologies currently being developed, as well as those envisioned. Here, Graham is clearly on much more familiar terrain, and his arguments are far more interesting and well-developed. Indeed, these two chapters provide a good introduction to a particular way of thinking through these kinds of issues that has not been given sufficient attention.

The basic line of argument through this more successful part of the book is that the ethical and moral issues supposedly engendered by contemporary and emerging biotechnologies are not in fact particularly new at all. For example, given current technologies, attempting to clone an adult human would be wildly unethical because the results of adult mammalian cloning are so uncertain, and so often result in deformities and other serious problems. That we ought not experiment on humans under these conditions does not require any new insights. With respect to future possible cloning technologies, Graham correctly points out that the problems with utilizing them are similar to the problems with utilizing other expensive assisted reproductive techniques – the reasons for pursuing such technologies are poor at best (162ff) (for more on this topic, see my review of Cole-Turner ed. 2001). The choices that individuals make given particular social circumstances are not, Graham argues, a good guide to the kinds of technologies we should, as a society, wish to make available and routine, since part of our goal should be to think about what kind of social circumstances we want people to find themselves in – what kinds of choices we, as a society, want to make available.

Graham does not, however, follow this line of reasoning in other places where it would seem equally appropriate. He is quite right, I think, to argue that there is nothing unique about the ethical issues that genetically modified agricultural products (including food crops) give rise to; as in the case of (human) assisted reproductive technologies, there are dangers of the ordinary sort to be weighed in cost-benefit analyses. The mere fact that transgenetic elements are used does not create any special risks not present before. But here, unlike in the case of assisted reproductive technologies, Graham fails to consider the context in which decisions involving contemporary agribusiness take place. Genetically modified organisms (GMOs) may not be uniquely bad, but that does not prevent them from being part of a bad system – a system that is reducing the number of kinds of agricultural products available and the genetic diversity of those products that are available, while increasing the distance, both physical and psychological, between most of us and the production of our food. The claims of those people committed to the current methods of food production notwithstanding, it is not at all clear that contemporary large-scale farming is necessary to ’feed the world,’ nor even that it is markedly more efficient than is small-scale farming (for related discussion, see Levins and Lewontin 1985). A more nuanced exploration of the role that GMOs play in contemporary debates about the role of agriculture in society would have been welcome.

Similarly, Graham’s discussion of the relationship between health insurance and genetic information seems strangely shallow compared to his analysis of assisted reproduction. The focus is oddly American; difficulties with getting health insurance, being dropped by one’s insurance company, etc., are concerns that have little place where ’health insurance’ is part of a national health system (as it is in most civilized countries, the U.S. excepted). It might be true, as Graham argues, that the claims that genetic information will radically transform private medical insurance are overblown. But these concerns, even if overblown, could provide an entry into the tricky questions of how we, as a society, wish to conceive of health insurance and access to the medical system more generally. While in his analysis of assisted reproduction Graham confronts the social context in which decisions regarding assisted reproduction are made, his analysis in the case of health insurance falls short.

Graham’s failure to follow up on the social role that health insurance plays and ought to play may be the result of his peculiar understanding of the concept of the equality of persons. Graham correctly notes for example, that the claim that human rights derive from the basic equality of persons cannot be premised on people being equal in every way. Oddly, he claims that the most plausible interpretation of the moral force of the equality in this context is that “no one is in a position to decide that the life of another is not worth living” (151). Now, while there is no consensus in political philosophy on how to interpret the basic equality of persons, Graham’s notion is much narrower, and rather weaker, than that found in more traditional formulations. Writers such as John Rawls, Amartya Sen, Robert Dahl, etc., seem to take the equality of persons to be about their moral and political equality; while different from each other in many ways, these views all reflect the Kantian notion that as beings that can set our own ends in life, and act to try to achieve these ends, we are owed a special kind of respect. Specifically, preventing us from setting and acting to achieve our own ends requires a particularly strong sort of justification; hence, social systems that encourage the development of people capable of making informed decisions about the ends they wish to pursue and who are capable of acting to pursue those ends are generally to be preferred over those that do not. Now, it certainly follows from this that “no one is in a position to decide that the life of another is not worth living” but the concept of political/moral equality is a much broader notion than Graham acknowledges, and does far more work in both contemporary political philosophy and in contemporary society. Taken seriously, it might for example point towards a justification for providing access to a reasonable level of health-care, irrespective of the health-risks people are born with.

The range of Graham’s interests as a philosopher is quite broad, extending from aesthetics, to Christian ethics, to the impact of contemporary technologies on society. Unfortunately, the material he confronts in Genes: A Philosophical Inquiry required rather more depth than Graham provided.


Futuyma, D. J. (1998) Evolutionary Biology Third Edition. Sinauer Associates. Sunderland, MA.

Gould, S.J. and Lewontin, R.C. (1979) “The spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian paradigm: a critique of the adaptationist programme” Proceedings of the Royal Society of London B205:581-598.

Kaplan, J.M. (2001) “Review of Beyond Cloning: Religion and the Remaking of Humanity,” (edited by Ronald Cole-Turner, Trinity Press, 2001). American Journal of Bioethics. 1(3): 68-69.

Levins, R. and Lewontin, R.C. (1985) The Dialectical Biologist Harvard University Press.

Lewontin, R.C. (1998), “The Evolution of Cognition: Questions We Will Never Answer”, In D. Scarborough and S. Sternberg, Methods, Models, and Conceptual Issues. An Invitation to Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 107-32.

Pigliucci, M. (2002) Beyond Nature vs. Nurture: the Genetics, Ecology and Evolution of Genotype-Environment Interactions. Johns Hopkins University Press, Baltimore, MD.

Pigliucci, M. and Kaplan, J.M. (2002) “The fall and raise of Dr. Pangloss: adaptationism and the Spandrels paper 20 years later” Trends in Ecology and Evolution, 15(2): 66-70.