Genetic Ethics: An Introduction

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Colin Farrelly, Genetic Ethics: An Introduction, Polity, 2018, 207pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745695044.

Reviewed by Jonathan Anomaly, University of San Diego


There are few more reliable ways to get attacked in public these days than by expressing sympathy for eugenics.[1] Often this reaction is a case of moral grandstanding.[2] Of course, much evil has been done in the name of eugenics.[3] But the word is ambiguous, and the past misapplication of a word or a theory doesn't mean the underlying principles are false. When we talk about "eugenics," do we mean enabling people to use biotechnology to improve their children's prospects? Or do we mean giving the state the power to murder those deemed undesirable? The differences matter. As Allen Buchanan and his co-authors argued twenty years ago,

Eugenics is remembered mostly for the outrages committed in its name. Terrible as they were, however, these wrongs do not, in themselves, tell us about the validity of eugenic moral thinking . . . For the history of eugenics to be instructive in ensuring social justice in a society with greater knowledge about genes, and perhaps some ability to alter them, the key question is whether eugenics was wrong in its very inception. Our review finds that much of the bad reputation of eugenics is traceable to attributes that, at least in theory, might be avoidable in a future eugenic program.[4]

Rather than signaling virtue by dismissing eugenics as intrinsically evil, Colin Farrelly applies virtue ethics to questions about what individuals and governments should do with the ability to shape the genetic endowment of future people. This approach puts Farrelly in a separate camp from consequentialists like Julian Savulescu and pluralists like Buchanan.[5] But it puts all three authors in the same camp of rationally assessing the potential of powerful new technologies that will allow us to influence the genetic characteristics of our children. Farrelly says early on that "eugenic aspirations can be morally defensible, even morally obligatory, when they pursue empirically sound and morally justified aims" (p. 22), and that each action or policy "must be considered on its own merits and demerits, rather than treated as one monolithic type of intervention" (p. 13).

Policies encouraging pregnant women to take folic acid and avoid mercury-rich fish during pregnancy aim to improve the welfare of future children. Mandatory vaccinations for children are intended to promote personal and population health. But vitamins and vaccines are not genetic interventions.

Farrelly mentions that some people are born with genetic resistance to HIV, so if they are exposed to the virus they will not develop AIDS (p. 67). Assume for the moment we could engineer or select an embryo so that the person it becomes is resistant to HIV. While there are plenty of reasons to think we shouldn't force parents to select embryos with specific kinds of immunity, this is a clear case in which individual choices and public policies affect the welfare of future people by making children more or less likely to be carriers -- and vectors -- of an infectious disease. In other words, this is a case in which Farrelly would advise us to consult the facts, consider the values at stake, and decide accordingly. But how does virtue ethics offer a different approach than, say, consequentialism, on questions of procreation?

Farrelly thinks that good parents and policymakers will be motivated by moral virtues like justice and beneficence, and exhibit intellectual virtues like epistemic humility and sensitivity to the best available information (p. 21). To take an example, he thinks that a virtuous policymaker might advocate public policies that show respect for the disabled, while also facilitating parents' ability to select embryos in a way that minimizes the chance of disability (p. 101). We could, for example, subsidize genetic tests for congenital disabilities for those who can't otherwise afford them, but also support laws that protect the disabled from abuse once they are born.[6]

Farrelly's application of virtue ethics to these issues is a novel contribution, though it's not always clear how virtue ethics improves on standard consequentialist approaches. It's especially unclear whether virtue ethics can help us navigate the kinds of collective action problems that will arise from our reproductive choices once we have the ability to screen, select, and alter human embryos. Sometimes selecting a trait can be individually rational, but collectively harmful. For example, immuno-diversity is important from a social standpoint, but it may be that parents doing what is best for their children will produce a distribution of traits that leaves a population worse off than they'd be if each selected differently.[7] Similar considerations apply to cognitive diversity.

Even if we can't engineer the precise traits we want our children to have, we'll be able to influence their traits through genetic selection. Here's one way that might happen: take a human skin cell, transform it into a pluripotent stem cell, then into a sperm or egg.[8] Combine eggs and sperm from you and your partner, or whoever you select as a donor, and create a bunch of embryos.[9] Then screen and rank the embryos by using polygenic scores to get a sense of the likelihood that the future child will be bright or dim, introverted or extroverted, short or tall.[10] If extroverts are (subjectively) happier on average than introverts, but introverts exhibit a unique style of problem-solving that benefits all, the human population could lose valuable diversity if too many parents select embryos for traits like extraversion.[11]

In cases like this, there may be a conflict between what's individually rational and collectively desirable. And there may be a tradeoff between creating a child who is likely to have relatively high levels of subjective satisfaction, and a child who may be more neurotic but also more motivated to achieve great things.[12]

We now know that virtually every trait we can think of is heritable,[13] so the range of possibilities that reproductive technology will enable is fantastically rich. It may be that some parents will choose to roll the genetic dice (apart from screening for basic Mendelian diseases like Tay Sachs or cystic fibrosis). Others will try to increase the chance of their children exhibiting traits that they care about. For example, to the extent that religiosity is heritable, and predicts subjective well-being, an unhappy atheist might want children who are more likely to be happy believers.

A character in George Bernard Shaw's masterpiece, Man and Superman, says, "The fact that a believer is happier than a skeptic is no more to the point than the fact that a drunken man is happier than a sober one." But if some people value subjective happiness over objective insight, perhaps they would want to engineer offspring that are inclined to be cheery and faithful rather than anxious and skeptical. Obviously genes don't strictly determine psychological characteristics, but they sculpt them in powerful ways.[14] As Farrelly emphasizes in the final chapter, the kinds of people we hope to create will be deeply influenced by what we think a worthwhile life looks like. A great virtue of Farrelly's book is that he lays out the terrain of reproductive ethics in a clear and humane way, and invites us to come to our own conclusions.

[1] A recent victim is Toby Young, who was pressured to resign from a government post in Britain after arguing that parents should be given access to future genetic technologies that might boost their children’s intelligence.

[2] See Tosi and Warmke, Moral Grandstanding: The Use and Abuse of Moral Language, Oxford University Press, 2019.

[3] Daniel Kevles, In the Name of Eugenics, Harvard University Press, 1985.

[4] From Chance to Choice. Cambridge University Press, 2000, p. 43

[5] See Savulescu and Kahane (2009), "The Moral Obligation to Produce Children with the Best Chance of the Best Life." 2009. Bioethics, 23(5):274-90; and Allen Buchanan, Better than Human? Oxford University Press, 2011.

[6] See Jonathan Anomaly, "Defending Eugenics: From Cryptic Choice to Conscious Selection" 2018. Monash Bioethics Review 35: 24-35.

[7] See Gyngell and Douglas, "Stocking the Genetic Supermarket: Reproductive Genetic Technologies and Collective Action Problems." 2015. Bioethics 29(4): 241-50

[8] See Henry Greely, The End of Sex and the Future of Human Reproduction, Harvard University Press, 2016.

[9] See Dov Fox, Birth Rights and Wrongs, Oxford University Press, 2019.

[10] See Robert Plomin, Blueprint: How DNA Makes Us Who We Are, MIT Press, 2018. 

[11] See Anomaly, Gyngell, and Savulescu, "Great Minds Think Different: Preserving Cognitive Diversity in an Age of Gene Editing." forthcoming.

[12] See Daniel Nettle, "The Evolution of Personality Variation in Humans and Other Animals." 2006. American Psychologist 61(6): 622-631.

[13] See Polderman et al, "Meta-Analysis of the Heritability of Human Traits Based on Fifty Years of Twin Studies." 2015. Nature Genetics 47(7): 702-709.

[14] See Thomas Bouchard. "Genetic Influence on Human Psychological Traits." 2004. Current Directions in Psychological Science 13(4): 148-151.