Genetics and Christian Ethics

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Celia Deane-Drummond, Genetics and Christian Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 281pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521536375.

Reviewed by Ruth Groenhout, Calvin College


Most contemporary discussions of the ethical dimensions of the new genetic technologies tend to adopt either a deontological or a utilitarian theoretical framework. Deane-Drummond's book, one in a series on Christian ethics from Cambridge, adopts, instead, a virtue ethics framework, grounded in the philosophy of Thomas Aquinas. She argues in the first chapters that this approach is preferable to its alternatives, and then develops the main features of what such a view would look like. Subsequent chapters offer very careful and detailed summaries of the current state of various aspects of genetic technology, each of which is then analyzed from Deane-Drummond's chosen perspective. The topics covered in these latter chapters range from the historical relationship between genetic technologies and eugenics, to genetic testing, gene patenting, gender issues in the new genetic technologies, and environmental concerns.

The book is wide ranging and offers clear and deep analysis of the many complex issues involved in the new genetic technologies. The author clearly knows the science whereof she speaks, and has a deep understanding of the various ethical concerns that the science raises. She is perceptive in noting the many ways that the ethical frameworks chosen to address such issues may not be helpful. For example, it is relatively commonplace for Christian ethicists, discussing issues of gene patenting, to resort to the language of the image of God to explain why it might be morally wrong to patent parts of the human genome. Deane-Drummond presents these arguments clearly and fairly. "However," she points out, "localizing human dignity in DNA is misguided in as much as it seems [to imply] that 'human nature' is resident in the genes (p. 171)." While this sort of genetic reductionism is problematic, especially for theorists who want to draw on the concept of the image of God as the source of human dignity, Deane-Drummond notes that the concerns such theorists raise are worthy of consideration. The patenting of human genetic sequences, for example, is problematic for a number of reasons, but Deane-Drummond argues convincingly that the main reasons have to do with issues of social justice rather than an infringement on the image of God that human DNA offers.

Patenting human genetic sequences poses any number of social problems. It is likely to make essential medical research difficult, if not impossible, because it makes whole chunks of genetic material unavailable for research. It occurs in the context of exploitive relationships between large corporations and the human subjects who provide the DNA used to develop patents, but receive little or no benefit from the patenting. (This issue becomes particularly problematic when the patented DNA sequences are obtained from indigenous groups who have not been, perhaps cannot be, properly informed of the reasons for obtaining samples, and who generally are completely excluded from any benefits resulting from the patents.) It is based on a problematic interpretation of patent law. In the past, biological patents were limited to processes that produced (or identified) specific materials, but the particular materials themselves could not be patented. Current patent law in the US permits patenting particular DNA sequences, rather than limiting patents to the processes used to identify them, modify them, or the like. Many theorists consider this a worrisome change in the global conception of patenting. There are other social justice issues involved here, but these are representative. Deane-Drummond sensibly points out that if the main ethical problems with patenting human genetic sequences is a matter of clear social injustice, arguments based on problematic use of the 'image of God' trope are less than helpful in thinking through what is or ought to be acceptable or prohibited in this context.

This gives an example, I think, of the real strengths of Deane-Drummond's work. She knows both the science and the ethical concerns raised by the science in detail, and I recommend the book highly to anyone concerned to gain an in-depth understanding of what the issues are and what a Christian, Thomistic-based virtue response to the issues might look like. This book is head and shoulders above the fairly simplistic analysis, Christian and secular both, frequently found on these topics, and it is well worth adding to any collection. I highly recommend the book as it offers accurate science and clear ethical analysis.

Having said this, there are a few minor quibbles I have with the book, though I emphasize that they are minor. There is some unfortunate sloppiness in the editing of the book. The most egregious example concerns Jesse Gelsinger, a young man who died as a result of experimental gene therapy, and whose death prompted extensive scrutiny of experimental protocols used in testing gene therapies. Gelsinger's name is misspelled throughout Chapter 6, an unfortunate error in an otherwise extremely well-informed book. Another minor quibble: in Chapter Four, discussing the ethical controversies surrounding release of information obtained from genetic testing, an American writer would naturally focus on worries that insurance companies would use such information to deny coverage to individuals whose genetic make-up predisposes them to certain conditions. Women with the genetic sequence that is associated with a high risk of breast cancer, for example, might find that any insurance policies available to them excluded treatment for breast cancer due to their 'pre-existing condition' of genetic susceptibility. This issue has been a matter of intense debate in the U.S. context. Deane-Drummond mentions it only in passing, however, I assume because it has not been an issue for a country that is sufficiently civilized to provide universal health coverage; in such a context the problem simply is not as urgent. But the issue is important enough to warrant more extensive coverage.

As I say, these are quibbles, and only worth mentioning in passing. A more substantive concern that the book raises derives from the author's use of a Thomistic virtue ethics approach to ethical analysis. Deane-Drummond situates herself squarely in the Thomistic tradition, but in the virtue side of Thomas' thought more than the Natural law side. She provides a clear and concise account of Thomas' vision of the virtues, and argues that the complex of virtues, natural and infused, connected with the concept of wisdom, provide the best position from which to engage genetic issues. The alternatives she identifies are, first, an abstract principles approach that offers a law-oriented approach to Christian ethics, and second, a consequentialist approach, often utilized by love-oriented Christian ethicists. I am inclined to agree with Deane-Drummond that a virtue-ethics approach offers as adequate a starting point as alternative theories. While critics of virtue ethics often charge that it fails to provide the concrete guidance that its rivals offer, Deane-Drummond argues convincingly that the theorists who have offered either deontological or consequentialist accounts of Christian ethics are not able to offer any more non-question-begging advice than those working in the virtue context.

The problem comes when Deane-Drummond argues that virtue ethics provides a better theoretical context from which to analyze the new genetic technologies. She has very good things to say on the various concrete issues she addresses, and I would have no hesitation in recommending this book to anyone who wanted a careful analysis of the issues it covers. But as is so often the problem with any analysis that purports to begin from a theoretical account of ethics and use that account to resolve issues of an applied nature, the analysis Deane-Drummond offers, while clearly within the boundaries of what virtue ethics could prescribe, is not clearly derived from that theoretical context.

An example: in Chapter Six, which covers gene therapies, Deane-Drummond considers what sorts of gene therapies might be acceptable, what sorts of procedures for generating the therapeutic material (manipulation of embryonic stem cells, for example) should be permitted or prohibited, and the like. She argues that the virtue of prudence is particularly important when dealing with questions of this sort, because these questions ask us to draw conclusions without knowing what the future might bring. Genetic therapies offer fruitful material for speculation: popular prophecies about what they might offer range from utopias without illness to dystopias in which individuals cannibalize others' genetically engineered organs. And our inability to predict what sorts of results could be generated is made even more complicated by our inability to know in advance which techniques and procedures might be efficacious, which largely worthless. For example, Chinese physicians currently offer stem cell injections as an experimental therapy for spinal cord injuries. But the therapy is being offered without clear evidence that injecting stem cells has any medical value; most gene therapy utilizes viral vectors to insert gene sequences directly into the DNA.

Gene therapies, then, offer a situation where the stakes are high, the costs could be great whatever choices we make, and we must reason under conditions of great uncertainty. Deane-Drummond is correct to argue that in such a case prudence will serve us well. Would that those who make laws concerning these matters actually displayed it once in a while! But that is a different issue from trying to use the theoretical notion of prudence (the abstract concept, not the instantiated virtue) for purposes of determining what sorts of legal restrictions need to be put in place. For this latter task, virtue ethics seems no better, and no worse, than its rivals. Some deontologists have produced analyses of gene therapies that are insightful and well-informed; other deontologists have produced analyses of gene therapies that are simplistic and wrong-headed. Consequentialists have developed a similar range of analyses.

The problem here is that one's analysis of the ethical complexity of developing and implementing genetic therapies will be driven more by factors such as one's knowledge of the actual science involved, of how medical practice incorporates new technologies, of how carefully one investigates the potential moral results of any particular technology, and the like. This probably does have something to do with whether an individual has herself developed the virtue of prudence, but I am skeptical that a theoretical understanding of the various aspects of prudence will offer much in the way of guidance. And the virtue of prudence, alas, will not necessarily be characteristic of all and only virtue ethicists.

Further, as is the case with any attempt to draw connections between theory and application, what will count as prudent from one perspective will appear highly imprudent from another. Deane-Drummond does not offer much in the way of determining which version of prudence it would be prudent to adopt (Aristotle's? Epictetus'? St. Thomas'?) though she does, at times, argue that some of what is assumed to be obvious in the natural law reasoning emanating from the Vatican needs to be re-thought. In part she is justified in adopting this approach because she is writing in the Christian context (presumably ruling out both Aristotle and Epictetus except insofar as their reasoning concurs with the general Christian tradition.) But debates over the contentious matters raised by the new genetic technologies go on within the Christian tradition as well as outside it. There will be deep differences of opinion between, say, traditional, conservative Catholics and liberal Catholics about just what prudence might mean in this context that virtue ethics simply has no way to resolve. Once the full range of Christian denominations are included, the differences will be even more dramatic. When considering gene therapies, for example, my Mennonite friends are likely to offer a very different account of prudence from my Presbyterian friends. Both accounts may be ones that fit within the general rubric offered by St. Thomas -- both would take into account the need to consider issues of justice, to have a good grasp of the context and history of the issues, and the like -- but there seems no unbiased way to judge one as more prudent than the other.

While I would argue that this gap between the theoretical and the applied aspects of Deane-Drummond's argument is a problem for the book, I do want to note one way in which virtue ethics does provide resources that its rivals do not. Deane-Drummond regularly points out in this book that implementing a specific ethical recommendation will require placing limits on people's actions. It might require limits on what individuals can choose for themselves and for their children, or limits on what multi-national corporations can do in the pursuit of profit, or limits on what governments can regulate or allow. This, of course, is the sort of thing ethical theorists from all the various theoretical camps regularly identify. But Deane-Drummond goes a step further in her analysis. She reminds us that implementing these limits often requires ethical development itself. So, for example, legal limits on the pursuit of profit by large corporations will be less than effective if those who set policy for the corporations are not themselves sufficiently temperate to limit the pursuit of profit when it does not conduce to the common good. Limits on what individuals can choose for themselves or their children may be unpopular, and effectively imposing them might require fortitude on the part of legislators.

Virtue ethics focuses on who a person is, and this focus can broaden the range of our moral vision, from asking questions about what it might be right to do, to asking questions about what sorts of people we might have to become to do what is right. This aspect of ethical deliberation is one that is missing from large sections of the contemporary discussion. It is easy to find analyses of (say) the legal regulation of human embryo experimentation, but almost impossible to find analyses of what sorts of moral agents would be needed to enact such legislation and make it effective. Deane-Drummond's recognition that the second may be the more critical issue in many cases is, I think, a credit to the approach she has chosen.

Genetics and Christian Ethics is a valuable addition to the literature on the new genetic technologies. Deane-Drummond takes the technical literature from the Thomistic tradition, and the technical literature from contemporary genetic studies, and makes both intelligible without over-simplifying either. For that we owe her a debt of gratitude.