Genetics and Philosophy: An Introduction

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Paul Griffiths and Karola Stotz, Genetics and Philosophy: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 270pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521173902.

Reviewed by Alex Rosenberg, Duke University


Genetics long provided the philosophy of science with its favorite test bed for debating questions about reduction. The various theories and findings relevant to the dispute were easy to identify and not difficult to understand, unlike theories and findings in physics. As a test bed the inter-theoretical relations in genetics had the further advantage that they avoided vexed questions about how to reconcile physicalism and intentionality that face reduction in psychology. In the case of genetics, there was no question that the processes to be reduced and those to which they were to be reduced were unambiguously physical. So, if reduction turned out not to obtain in this domain, physicalism cum antireductionism would be strongly vindicated.  The vindication would be even stronger if the obstacle to reduction was multiple realizability, a version of Donald Davidson's anomalous monism rearing its head in biology. Still, a last feature of genetics that made questions of reduction exciting was the strong conviction among the sequence of Nobel Prize winning molecular biologists that their discoveries were vindicating reductionism. Nothing would please philosophers more than the revelation that the scientists were conceptually confused about their own science and needed philosophers to straighten them out.

There is a consensus in the philosophy of biology at least about how the debate about reductionism in genetics turned out: "1953 and all that. A tale of two sciences" -- the title of Philip Kitcher's widely anthologized paper -- said it all, or almost all. Whatever Watson and Crick thought they were doing in 1953 when reporting the molecular structure of the gene and speculating rather accurately on how it performed its hereditary function, it was not a reduction of the genes Mendel discovered and Morgan catalogued to macromolecules that compose them and effect their functions. Population genetics and molecular genetics remained two independent, autonomous sciences. And reductionism has given way to the study of mechanisms as a pathway to understanding inter-theoretical relations in the life sciences.

More recently genomics has proved an arena for a different sort of debate, one with ramifications beyond the philosophy of science, especially in matters of bioethics and social policy. This strand begins outside of philosophy in the 1970s when philosophers and others began to address claims by innatists in psychology, behavioral geneticists, and others seeking to pin differences in human behavior on genetic causes. The first of these was Arthur Jensen, whose work on the heritability of IQ attracted the attention of several philosophers of science as well as political philosophers. Debates about the merit of inferences from statistical heritability to genetic inheritance focused increasing interest on how genes interact with environmental factors in development, whether they constrain, instruct, program, or otherwise play a causally special role distinctive from other actual and potential difference makers in the emergence of human capacities and in the production of human behaviors.

In the philosophy of biology this debate eventually became one surrounding a thesis conveniently labeled 'genocentrism': the thesis that there is something special that the genes do in building and operating organisms, something so special that it may warrant claims that they determine or canalize outcomes in ways nothing else of biological significance does. Those philosophers who claimed a special role for genes were the very ones who had argued for the reduction of population genetics to molecular biology, while those who rejected genocentrism were usually among those who challenged reductionism. Yet the two disputes were quite distinct and came to involve quite different philosophically significant matters.

In particular, this second dispute about genocentrism came to involve significant debates about what computation and programming, the nature of information, the role of metaphor, and most of all what concepts of causation are at work in genomics. For these were the conceptual devices that the two sides to the debate eventually invoked to defend their views.

Paul Griffiths and Karola Stotz have been principals in both the debate about reductionism and the debate about genocentrism. Unlike others, they have devoted a significant amount of intellectual energy to keeping track of the developments in molecular biology. Investing the time to follow the fortunes of various hypotheses, models, and broader research programs in this field has been both expensive and indispensible. Expensive, since few areas of the life sciences have moved so far so fast over the period since 1953, and at an accelerating rate since the completion of the human genome primary sequence in 2000. Just keeping score of the complications has been beyond the endurance of most of the other specialists in the reductionism debate of the last century. But it has been indispensible as well, since much of the debate from the very outset was driven by emerging discoveries of how much more complex than biologists originally thought the molecular biology of the gene was turning out to be. Additionally, both have been strong opponents of genocentrism, and proponents (indeed Griffiths was amongst the founders of) "developmental systems theory," a sustained alternative to genocentrism at the time it was a much more widely held view.

Griffiths and Stotz provide the best available treatment of the issues in these two debates that still bear significant philosophical pay-off for contemporary debates, especially the ones that emerge from or may help settle the issues regarding genocentrism. Much of their book is devoted to helping non-molecular biologists understand the current concept of the gene in that subdiscipline -- not an easy task. But Griffiths and Stotz use the opportunity as well to show us something about how the meaning and conceptual role of a theoretically significant noun 'gene' evolves over a century, identifying crucial inflection points and explaining why they moved the biologist's concept of the gene in the ways they did. The philosopher of biology less well versed in molecular genetics than Griffiths and Stotz will profit immensely from treating this volume as a textbook introduction to the subject.

Building on papers they wrote separately and together in the last decade or so, Griffiths and Stotz identify the schizophrenic character of the noun 'gene' as far back as the '30s, when its instrumental role as a device for predicting trait distributions was beginning to come apart from its role as a hypothesized material thing whose structure required elucidation in order to explain its heuristic role.

The initial assumption of the biologists was, of course, that the location and structure of the material thing would elucidate the predictive power of its heuristic role, in roughly the way atomic theory showed that location and properties of electrons and nucleons could elucidate the predictive power of Mendeleev's periodic table of the elements. A few of the developments in 20th century genetics vindicated this vision, but not most others. The Mendelian gene as a "calculating device" continued to prosper until it became indispensible in many areas of the life sciences, especially agronomy. Meanwhile exceptions to the regularities in which it figured began to point geneticists to the material substance that realized the entity so useful in organizing and predicting observations. But because the regularities remained so useful in applied science, there was no tendency to revise them or reconfigure them to reflect what was being learned about how the Mendelian gene was implemented. This is because, in Griffiths and Stotz's terms, "The molecular gene can only take over the role of the Mendelian gene if it can take over its role in genetic analysis" (31). And it can't. Much of the rest of their book is devoted to explaining why this is and what its significance is. That many different double helical sequences of different nucleic acid molecules multiply realizes the Mendelian gene is only the tip of the iceberg for explaining why the molecular gene alone can't do the work of the Mendelian gene. Griffiths and Stotz explain why. But they have bigger fish to fry, wanting to argue not just that the molecular gene can't do all the work the Mendelian gene does, but also that there are other things besides the DNA that do this work. That's what really defeats reductionism, and also undermines genocentrism.

Griffiths and Stotz do credit the research program of molecular biology with a successful commitment to a mild form of reductionism. The reductions of molecular biology turn out to be the elucidation of mechanisms, sensu William Bechtel et al., which accords a fundamental role to organization of components, a role stronger than forms of reductionism are alleged to be unable to accommodate. The few strong reductionists remaining will be excused for wondering whether the organization required is nothing more than spatiotemporal, a set of relations they have no difficulty accommodating. (See Frost-Arnold, 2004 and Delehanty 2005.) The real issue in these debates as well as in psychology is whether downward causation obtains. Here there are powerful "causal exclusion" arguments due to Kim with which one expects the authors to wrestle. These they circumvent thus:

The trouble with the causal exclusion argument . . . is that it uses an ontological conception of causation to attack epistemic reductionism. It treats causation as something ontic which moves the world on from one stage to the next, and concludes that there is no need -- and therefore no place -- for any more causation than is captured in fundamental physics. But . . . epistemic antireductionism is not an ontological claim. It is a family of claims about the relationship between different scientific domains and their bodies of knowledge. In this context, a more appropriate conception of causation is something like that offered by Woodward (2003). Causation is a certain kind of relationship between variables: namely, a relationship that can be used to make things happen in the system. There is no reason to think that the causal exclusion principle applies to such a conception. (104)

The passage is worth quoting for it helps us understand the scope and limits of many aspects of Griffiths and Stotz's approach to the dispute, and to the matter of genocentrism.

First, many parties to the reductionist/antireductionist dispute have always accepted the epistemic irreducibility of Mendelian genetics and its successors to molecular genetics. But as far back as Kitcher (1984), antireductionists specifically took as their task to show that irreducibility was not merely a reflection of our cognitive limitations, and to show that there were true generalizations we would miss (Sober, 1984), not just useful rules of thumb we couldn't conveniently express, if we did not recognize the irreducible autonomy of non-molecular genetic facts. The problem for antireductionists was to establish a strong "metaphysical" thesis that combined physicalism -- a metaphysical thesis, with antireductionism. When the latter is treated as epistemic, however, there is not much of a problem of reconciliation.

Second, it is by no means clear that Woodward's interventionist account of causation is exclusively metaphysical, and (perhaps therefore) immune to causal exclusion arguments. After all, Woodward takes sides on the adequacy of higher-level explanations while endorsing a broad physicalism. Unless explanatory adequacy is cashed out in terms of cognitive and evidential satisfaction only, and not also in descriptive accuracy about facts in the world, Woodwardian higher-level causation and downward causation (if any) faces the same problem as the physicalist antireductionists.

Third, and most importantly in the present connection, Woodward's conception of causation as intervention plays a crucial role in the debate over genocentrism, a matter far more consequential for Griffiths and Stotz than antique debates about reductionism. As far back as his well known paper with Russell Grey (Griffiths and Grey, 1994), alone and together with Stotz, Griffiths has argued for a 'causal parity' thesis: "the parity thesis assets that the roles of causal factors in development do not fall neatly into two kinds, one role played exclusively by DNA and RNA sequences, and the other role exclusively played by elements other than the nucleic acids" (160). Instead, causally distinctive roles in development are spread over genomic and nongenomic factors. This apparently anodyne thesis is actually quite consequential in biology and in the philosophy of biology owing largely to the character of the thesis with which it is contrasted. Genocentrism is the claim that the genes play a special role in development owing to their informational character. This claim is required by Francis Crick's "central dogma" that information moves from DNA to RNA to proteins. It is explicated by philosophers like C. Kenneth Waters (2007) who argue that genes have a special role in development due to the Woodwardian role of the information that carry.

This dispute preoccupies most of the 100 pages that are the heart of Griffiths and Stotz's book. There has been much debate among philosophers of biology since Rosenberg (1985) about the nature of information in molecular biology. Griffiths and Stotz helpfully stipulate a definition that comports with Crick's use of the term: Crick-information is the ability to causally specify the linear sequence -- the order of molecules, usually either nucleic acids or amino acids -- of a gene product. Employing Woodward's concept of causation, Waters (2007) has argued that interventional experiments reveal that only the genes have the causally specific role of carrying Crick information. Accordingly, the genes have a unique role in development, one on which might be built consequential conclusions regarding innateness of some traits, or at least the narrow canalization of them by the genome, or even a theory about the foundations of information in the biosphere and perhaps even an account of neural information and the realization of intentionality by neural networks.

Griffiths and Stotz subject Waters' version of genocentrism to a sustained two prong attack. First they adduce a great deal of detailed recent evidence that "the role of acting as a [specific actual difference maker -- a Woodwardian cause] for sequences in gene products is not monopolised by DNA but is distributed among DNA sequences, regulatory RNAs, proteins, and environmental signals" (81). Second, what Crick information the DNA does carry, and which may have a causally specific role with respect to biologically significant gene products, is often accorded to the molecular gene by nongenetic factors. In many cases in fact, according to Griffiths and Stotz, the specific sequence of the DNA is just the organism's way of informationally controlling development of its offspring. In the language of the biologist, the nongenetic environment of the gene sequence is not just "permissive", it is "instructive" when it comes to what gene products will be synthesized and assembled into a new organism. Much of the work they report comes under the label of 'epigenesis' -- the organized causally specific modification of gene sequences to control their expression in development. The crucial question about epigenetics is whether the source of such modification is to be found elsewhere in the genome, in genes that regulate other genes (as in the case of much regulatory/structural gene interaction), or whether there is a non-genetic mode of inheritance that operates to modify somatic genes independently of DNA copying DNA. If the latter is the case, genocentrism may be sustainable though as a more complicated matter than biologists like Crick originally thought. Griffiths and Stotz do the best they can to marshal empirical findings from a range of biological subdomains, up to and including cultural factors, to argue that many of these factors do not operate by changing regulatory nucleotide sequences. Crick information is in fact distributed widely in developmental differences makers and the gene sensu stricto has no claim on a special causal role.

Finally, Griffiths and Stotz turn to the wider philosophical debate about whether the genome carries information in a semantic sense, and if so, whether we can build it out of (clearly non-intentional, "causal covariance") Crick information. This question has been debated by Kim Sterelny, John Maynard Smith, Peter Godfrey-Smith and others. A teleosemantic, evolutionary account of the developmental meaning of gene sequences, as Griffiths and Stotz note, has tempted several biologists along with a few philosophers, to suppose that Crick information can be accorded semantic content. But this, they convincingly argue, is to confuse biologically ultimate evolutionary explanations with the proximate mechanistic explanations of how Crick information is conveyed from gene to gene-product. They do not consider whether there is a nonsemantic, purely syntactic computational sense in which genes program development, as some biologists and philosophers have argued. Perhaps they consider that this thesis is already refuted by their epigenetic arguments.

As a textbook Genetics and Philosophy deserves unalloyed praise for bringing the philosopher of biology a great deal closer to the research frontier of genomics and systems biology than anything anyone else has even tried to do in the past. As an assessment for biologists of competing research programs -- reductionist and integrative – it uniquely combines a vantage point and credibility about which scientific directions will be more promising. Like all sallies in a philosophical debate it will elicit serious responses that will also move our somewhat more parochial debates forward.


Delehanty, M. "Emergent properties and the context objection to reduction," Biology and Philosophy 20.4 (2005): 715-734.

Frost-Arnold, G, 2004, "How To Be an Anti-reductionist about Developmental Biology" Biology and Philosophy, 19: 75-91.

Griffiths, P. and Grey, R, 1994, "Developmental systems and evolutionary explanation," Journal of Philosophy, 91 (6): 277-304.

Kitcher, P., 1984, "1953 and all that. A tale of two sciences," Philosophical Review, 93: 337-59.

Rosenberg, A., 1985, The Structure of Biological Science, Cambridge, UK, Cambridge University Press.

Sober, E., 1984, The Nature of Selection, Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

Waters, C. K., 2007, "Causes that make a difference," Journal of Philosophy, 104 (11): 551-79.

Woodward, J., 2003, Making Things Happen, New York, Oxford University Press.