Genocide: A Normative Account

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Larry May, Genocide: A Normative Account, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 283pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521122962.

Reviewed by Chandran Kukathas, London School of Economics


The Polish lawyer and Holocaust survivor, Raphael Lemkin, coined the term 'genocide' in a book published in 1944 on Axis Rule in Occupied Europe.[1] Lemkin devoted his energies over the next four years to agitating for the recognition of this crime by international law and was instrumental in the drafting and eventual promulgation of the 1948 Genocide Convention. Since then, legal analysis of this controversial notion has grown as the term has come to occupy a distinctive place in law and, no less importantly, in popular discourse. Everyone knows the term 'genocide'. Over the past 60 years there have been countless historical studies of particular genocides, as well as numerous comparative discussions, notably Ben Kiernan's Blood and Soil: A World History of Genocide and Extermination from Sparta to Darfur.[2] Yet while historians, lawyers, psychologists, sociologists, political scientists and international relations theorists have published extensively on the question of genocide, philosophers have been conspicuously silent on the subject. Larry May's study is the first substantial philosophical work on genocide.[3] This is surprising given the controversy that has surrounded the concept from its very beginnings. It is not so much that disciplinary boundaries matter, or that lawyers and historians are incapable of conceptual analysis. It is rather that there are questions that have preoccupied philosophers that are thrown into particularly sharp relief by the problem of genocide, and there is much that philosophers can contribute -- and learn -- by paying greater attention to this moral notion.

Larry May's philosophical study is an outstanding contribution to our understanding of genocide, as well as to our appreciation of a number of theoretical problems that are addressed in the book. Although it is a freestanding work, it is a part of a larger project that produced three other substantial Cambridge books: Crimes against Humanity: A Normative Account (2005), War Crimes and Just War (2007), and Aggression and Crimes against Peace (2008). In combination these works amount to an enormous achievement. The breadth of scholarship is impressive in itself: Professor May has mastered a substantial legal and historical literature in order to address the questions he has posed. Yet he has offered much more than a tour of extant works on war and war crimes. He set out to supply and succeeded in producing an account of the moral foundations of international criminal law. Genocide is a crucial part of the account.

May's study is divided into five parts. The first deals with the nature and value of groups, the second with the harm of genocide, the third with a number of conceptual problems associated with the term, the fourth with responsibility for genocide, and the fifth with problems of intervention to prevent genocide and punishment for crimes of genocide. It would take a very long review to engage seriously with all these aspects of his study. Rather than treat each of these topics sketchily, let me focus on the first part of his book, since this is the foundation of his analysis and, philosophically, the most pertinent given his aims.

According to Article II of the UN Convention on the Prevention and Punishment of the Crime of Genocide (1948), an act of genocide is one that is committed 'with intent to destroy, in whole or in part, a national, ethnical, racial or religious group, as such'. What is crucial in this definition is that the wrong in question is the attempt to destroy a group rather than the killing of persons. In crafting the term 'genocide', Lemkin had been prompted by his experience and interpretation of the Holocaust, which he viewed as a new kind of crime by which perpetrators sought not just to destroy persons but to eliminate peoples -- 'groups as such'. The wrong was not mass murder (which is probably what genocide appears to be in the popular imagination) but group destruction. According to the 1948 Convention, group destruction could be brought about not only by killing, but also by inflicting group conditions of life calculated to bring about physical destruction in whole or in part, by imposing measures intended to prevent birth within the group, or by forcible transfer of children to other groups. Lemkin had wanted an even more capacious definition that would have included as genocidal any acts calculated to destroy buildings, or artistic works, or cultural artifacts that were central to a group's identity; and he was also unhappy with the idea of considering only national, ethnical, racial and religious groups as possible victims of genocide. The parties responsible for drafting the Convention definition were, of course, concerned as much to ensure that their states did not fall foul of any law they made as they were to establish the terms for addressing the crimes that had been committed during the Second World War. The matter of the nature and moral standing of groups was therefore of central importance.

Larry May begins by defending a nominalist view of the idea of a group that he says is inspired by Ockham and Hobbes. From Ockham he takes the idea that groups have no independent existence, but from Hobbes he takes the idea that groups are artificial persons that can be understood as agents. What makes for the existence of a group is the relationship among the persons that compose it. Crucially, there has to be mutual recognition by members of the group -- a "publicity condition". (32) Of course when genocide is at issue what matters is not so much whether a group can act but whether it is something that can be harmed or destroyed. Here May draws on Grotius's discussion of the idea of a people to argue that 'a group may be destroyed if what constitutes its form is destroyed.' (34) A group is something with a 'form' that has a certain stability. Its members share a relationship reflecting common interests -- but only those interests that are significant and publicly recognizable are relevant. A group can be destroyed if that which holds it together can be destroyed. Thus auburn-haired people do not constitute a group, but the Jewish people do.

There are some important objections to this nominalist view, and May tries to take account of them. 'Constitutive theorists', he notes, would take issue with the idea of individuals having agency outside of some social context, perhaps even while thinking of themselves as nominalists. They might acknowledge that groups are made up of individuals, but also think that individual action and harm to individuals are matters that are dependent upon individuals being embedded in a social context. On this view, May is too much of a hard nominalist who does not see social practices that constitute individuals as having any independent reality. But here May simply insists that he does not think that there is a reality independent of individuals. Any harm that is suffered must ultimately be suffered by individuals. It is true nonetheless that individuals do exist in, and are shaped by, their social contexts, and radical individualists who deny this are mistaken. May's concern is to steer a path between these two poles: hard nominalism and 'collectivism' (May's term). The critical question then becomes: how do we determine the legitimacy of groups, and May argues here that it is not enough to accept (one interpretation of) Hobbes's view that legitimacy is decided by a sovereign power: the groups have to be publicly recognized (which involves mutual recognition by members of the group). In short, groups are fictions; but this does not mean that we cannot distinguish (both metaphysically and normatively) legitimate from illegitimate fictions.

It might seem odd for a normative theorist to get involved in such questions in advance of an engagement with the ethical problem of genocide. But there is a point. The issue of what counts as a group has been highly contentious in international law, and the Genocide Convention restricts its purview to national, ethnical, racial and religious groups. The problem of how to identify such groups or of what counts as a group has been central to legal debate. One of the foremost legal scholars of genocide, William Schabas, has argued that for people to count as a group in genocide law they must have some 'objective existence' as a group. He has further asserted that such an understanding of groups as having an objective existence leads to the conclusion that only the Convention's four categories of group can carry any weight, and that efforts to expand the number by allowing for more subjective considerations would mean recognizing groups with no real existence.[4] May's concern is that the Genocide Convention is too limiting in excluding other groups, such as political groups for example. He thinks that assertions of the existence of objective groups are without foundation. This leads him, ultimately, to recommend changes to the Convention that make its understanding of what counts as a group more open-ended. (See 57-58) His revised definition reads thus:

'genocide' means any of the following acts committed with intent to destroy, in whole or in part, a publicly recognized group that is relatively stable and significant for the identity of its members, such as a national, ethnical, racial or religious group, as such. (58)

The upshot of May's revision of the Convention is to enable us to say that in the Cambodian case, people who wore eyeglasses did not constitute a group, even though they were targeted by the Khmer Rouge for elimination; but the Tutsis of Rwanda, who were identified by government-issued identity cards, did constitute a group. In the Tutsi case, the publicity condition is satisfied, while in the Cambodian case it is not.[5] This, May suggests, is the right result.

While it is important to revise the Convention in the direction May suggests, I am not sure that the best way to defend the revision is by rethinking the basis of group identification in this way. Can the significance of the group really be what sustains the judgment that genocide is a crime? If it is, then May's revision is entirely to be welcomed. If it is not, then refining our understanding of what constitutes a group is not so important -- and may even be beside the point.

Let me make a distinction between two conceptions of the group: the collective and the corporate conceptions. On the collective conception, the value of the group lies in its capacity to serve the interests of its members -- say, by providing goods and services, and also by creating a sense of identity. On this conception, the group matters only contingently, for it has value only insofar as it serves the interests of members, those interests being independent of the group's existence. If people drift into other groups that provide better services and supply new identities, there is no loss if the group disappears. (What matters is that people have some services or some identity they are content with, not that they have any particular goods or identities.) On the corporate conception, however, the value of the group persists independently of the interests of its members because the group itself, by its very existence, makes something else available in the world. On this conception, it is possible for the interests of the group and the interests of its members to diverge.

The corporate conception of the group is troubling for at least two reasons. First, it potentially elevates the group above the well-being or interests of members, implying it may be wrong for them to try to leave or reform the group if this would undermine its very character. It could subordinate the lives of real persons to an abstraction. It might even in some cases put subgroups in conflict withgroups of which they are a part, as the problem of which group's character or identity should be privileged becomes an issue. Second, if the value of groups lies in the benefit it brings to the world, it may turn out that some groups are less valuable than others -- and some not at all.

Tying the wrong of genocide to the wrong of destroying the group means invoking the corporate conception. On the collective conception, destruction of the group is bad only if the members are harmed; but on this view it is the harm to members that is the relevant bad, not the destruction of the group. So tying the wrong of genocide to the wrong of destroying the group requires invoking the corporate conception. The claim that genocide is wrong because it involves the destruction of a group therefore implies a claim that it is always a bad thing for a group to be eliminated or lost. If this position is not defensible, the idea that genocide is wrong because it harms the group as such is not defensible either. It seems unlikely that we can plausibly say that the loss of any group is bad. If we retreat to the position that the loss of only some groups is bad, however, we would find ourselves in the undesirable position of having to rest our objections to genocide on the assertion that harming valuable groups is bad and, so, implying that harming others that lack worth is not.

The thought this leads to is that if our concern is harm to persons, the focus on the destruction of groups as such that is the heart of the Genocide Convention may be the source of a difficulty that cannot be overcome by a more nuanced definition of 'group'. My own view is that what is in fact crucial, morally speaking, is mass killing rather than group destruction.

All that said, the Genocide Convention is in place, and in the 1990s it began to be applied for the first time as prosecutions were brought against alleged perpetrators of genocide in the Balkans and Rwanda. In the current legal context, it is necessary to address problems of establishing responsibility, or legal and moral complicity, for genocide in order to do justice. The matter does not end, however, with establishing whether or not genocide has taken place, or determining who is guilty. 'Genocide' identifies a complex phenomenon that raises difficult questions about humanitarian intervention in advance of the committal of genocidal acts and about the reconciliation of people in societies that have seen, and participated in, such horrors. Larry May's book guides us carefully through the many questions and problems that arise. It is the place to start for any serious ethical inquiry into what has aptly been described as 'a problem from hell'.[6]

[1] Axis Rule in Occupied Europe: Laws of Occupation, Analysis of Government, Proposals for Redress, second edition by The Lawbook Exchange, Clark, New Jersey, 2008, ch. IX 'Genocide'.

[2] New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.

[3] The bibliography contains no references even to philosophical papers on genocide, other than one by Larry May himself, though David Luban's work on crimes against humanity is cited and discussed.

[4] Schabas, Genocide in International Law: The Crime of Crimes, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009, 110ff, cited in May 30-32.

[5] At least with respect to the killing of people wearing eye-glasses. The Khmer Rouge also targeted some ethnic and religious groups, such as Buddhists.

[6] The expression comes from US Secretary of State Warren Christopher in remarks made in 1993. See Samantha Power, 'A Problem from Hell': America and the Age of Genocide, London: Harper, 2007, 306.