Genuine Pretending: On the Philosophy of the Zhuangzi

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Hans-Georg Moeller and Paul J. D'Ambrosio, Genuine Pretending: On the Philosophy of the Zhuangzi, Columbia University Press, 2017, 221 pp., $35.00, ISBN 9780231183994.

Reviewed by Susan Blake, Bard College


"A romp through 'the vast wilds of open nowhere'" -- Roger Ebert
"Better than any existing work on humor" -- Aristotle
"Nothing more than a success" -- Guy Smiley
"A demonstration of nothing . . . in a technical sense" -- Ford Prefect
"A tour de force through the 'homeland of non-even-anything'" -- Steven Colbert

This book presents a novel reading of the Zhuangzi that illuminates its humor and presents it as responding to philosophical concerns of its day. To the extent that these philosophical concerns are also those of the present day -- the search for a sane and healthy response to the impossible demands of sincerity -- we can, through the discussion here, gain an understanding of an alternative to the unsatisfying ethical approaches of both sincerity and authenticity. The book is impressive in bringing together diverse passages in this difficult text under one interpretation.

In brief, Hans-Georg Moeller and Paul J. D'Ambrosio first detail the ways in which the history of Anglo-European philosophy has caused philosophers influenced by those traditions to misconstrue the Zhuangzi as defending authenticity, as happens in Heidegger's, Nietzsche's, and others' responses to the ethics of sincerity. The authors argue that while the Zhuangzi does react against the demand for sincere role performance in the Confucian tradition, we need not read it as employing a demand for authenticity. Instead, they propose that the text manifests an altogether different response -- genuine pretending, which is manifested through the text's humorous or humoristic subversions of sincere attempts to fill one's roles. In order to interpret the text, Moeller and D'Ambrosio develop a theory of humor based on those of Freud and Kant, as well as of John Morreall, Robert Latta, and Mikhail Bakhtin. Here, humoristic communication has the characteristic that it is intended to relax us and cause pleasure through distancing us from a serious situation, sometimes through a violation of expectations or incongruity based on paradox, irony, nonsense, or the like.

It relies heavily on Freud's notions of play and pretending, Kant's idea of dissolution of expectations into nothing, and Bakhtin's description of carnivalesque inversions as dissolving moral fear by undermining the moral mind-set. Humor, on this reading, presents an amoral response to the demands of morality by stressing their contingency. The word-play and examples of genuine pretending do not reveal a real self, but dis-covers the lack of any such thing -- it serves as a denial of essence, or anything beyond merely contingent facts of our lives.

Though the book begins with a characterization of Confucian role ethics, the section on humor seems to be its core. The book deals with the humoristic nature of several passages, including the Hundun "myth", the story of Liezi and his master Huzi, the passages in Chapter Five, and the Robber Zhi story. It also illustrates the ways in which many of these passages undermine Confucian values by telling stories in which those values are embodied in a topsy-turvy way by what are clearly not Confucian exemplars -- Robber Zhi and the characters in Chapter Five. In addition, though these characters are praised as having "virtue complete", it does not seem that the text holds any of them up as exemplars for us -- we are distanced from them by their strangeness and by their mix of attractive and repulsive qualities.

It may be helpful to look at another of these passages to illustrate the strengths and weakness of the approach. The passage that seems to possess the most characteristics of humoristic writing is that about Liezi. The authors read Liezi as a schlemiel who can't get things right -- he takes the physiognomist Jixian too seriously, fails to learn from his teacher, and ends up as he began, a stupid clod. Huzi, his teacher, doesn't teach but rather toys with Liezi and Jixian. Jixian is a scoundrel and a laughingstock. On this reading, the text presents none of these characters with approval, but treats them ironically and non-seriously. As a result, powerful emotions are alleviated, and the moral demands of this and similar didactic situations are lightened. There is no particular moral, but rather "an emptiness of meaning" (92). Moeller and D'Ambrosio present a clear and convincing reading of this passage not as advocating the adoption of a particular role -- teacher or student -- but as a mockery of roles and the rejection of their independent value.

However, there appear to be problems with the reading; the physigonomist is not presented by the Zhuangzi as a quack, but as someone with genuine, if limited, ability -- so Liezi's trust is not wholly misplaced, and he is not quite as ridiculous as presented here. Liezi does in fact seem to learn, and becomes the paradigm of simplicity -- the unhewn block or the clod of earth; as such, his progress seems to directly (rather than ironically) reflect the notion that we must give up the pursuit of knowledge. Further, the reading of this passage as compatible with a daojiao reading is somewhat incongruous -- if we read this passage as not presenting role models, what are we to make of Liezi's success? Reading Liezi ironically seems to make this passage incompatible with the daojiao reading that Moeller and D'Ambrosio seem to want to preserve alongside theirs.

Nevertheless, the inversion of values seen in the humoristic passages loosens the utterly serious grip of Confucianism, allowing us to free ourselves from the fear that we are not living up to our roles. These stories do not endorse an alternative set of values, but merely allow us to see moral values and roles differently. (In this, Moeller and D'Ambrosio's reading builds on Eric Schwitzgebel's interpretation of the text as therapeutic.) This characterization supports the overall reading of the perfected person or zhenren in other, non-humoristic passages. In addition, reading the humoristic passages as undermining the idea of an essential self corresponds well to what the Zhuangzi refers to as the "fasting of the mind" and "losing the self".

Genuine pretending is manifested by the "genuine person" or zhenren, who plays his roles well while investing them with no value. These zhenren have a number of features of Daoist sages: they know only the limits of their knowledge; they embody the ideal of transformation, constantly taking on new roles but not identifying with them; they engage in the free and easy wandering of the heart, at ease wherever they happen to be, employing intense sensitivity in perceiving it (166-7). They may be part of society, but do not invest its norms with value, and thus embody a healthy response to the exacting demands of Confucian society. Also, somewhat implausibly, Moeller and D'Ambrosio seem to be claiming that the skill stories exhibit a few individuals who respond spontaneously, not fixated on success -- and that this lack of fixation is the source of their success.

In any case, the text provides a response to the stress of the Confucian insistence on a sincere commitment to fulfilling social roles including having emotions appropriate to those roles -- first in defusing the seriousness of the requirements through humor, and then in presenting an alternative that does not value identification with one's roles, the zhenren. These moves are necessary, as the Confucian role ethics, as presented by Moeller and D'Ambrosio, requires that we develop an inner, emotional, commitment to the role played -- a requirement that is unverifiable and therefore constantly suspect. However, the zhenren nevertheless does not realize an authentic inner self, but merely stresses the continually changing contingencies of one's context.

I hope it is obvious from the description above that the book presents a powerful reading of the Zhuangzi; it does many things very well, foremost among them the interpretation of what are otherwise merely strange passages, as containing a humoristic element. Also valuable is the overarching reading that ties together many different elements. In particular, I appreciate the emphasis on the contingency of our situations, tied to the idea that the healthy response is not to identify too closely with the roles we inhabit, but to value change as much as constancy.

However, I will express two concerns that are of interest for further discussion. The first concerns the nature of the emotions presented in the Zhuangzi, and the ability of those zhenren who possess this kind of emotion to serve as ideals for us ordinary mortals. Because the Confucian commitment to sincerity requires a cultivation of proper emotion, it seems that the rejection of the Confucian ethics of sincerity requires a devaluing of these emotions. Moeller and D'Ambrosio suggest, however, that we need not become utterly emotionless, but must merely develop an immunity to one's emotions so that likes and dislikes do not harm us (174 ff). We should become like Mengsun Cai or Zhuang Zhou after the deaths of loved ones, experiencing the emotion but not "identifying" (177) with it and not perhaps allowing it to persist. However, this conception of emotion is odd -- it seems integral to an idea of emotion that it should move us, that we should not be merely observers of it, as I think is suggested here. As this concept of emotion is merely one part of Moeller and D'Ambrosio's description of the zhenren, it does not receive sufficient development, though it seems to be one of the many ways in which the concept of the mind here differs from our own.

Secondly, the search for a thread that runs through the whole text, for the "spirit" (13) of the text, is quixotic; given the probable diversity of the dates and ideals of the authors, there is bound to be something left out by a single comprehensive reading. Though the book does an admirable job of providing a reading that effectively unites apparently disparate elements, like the notions of rambling and of "true knowledge", it nevertheless leaves other threads out. The so-called "primitivism" of chapters 8-10, and the "Yangism" of chapters 28-31 (with the exception, perhaps, of the Robber Zhi narrative) fits ill with this reading. These threads seem to present ideals that are in tension with the notion of genuine pretending, insofar as they seem to genuinely recommend a withdrawal from society, and a commitment to the preservation of life, respectively -- concrete values that seem to preclude pretending.

An inability to draw the disparate ideas of the text into a single thread is hardly a shortcoming -- unless an interpretation seeks to do so, as this one seems to. Further, Moeller and D'Ambrosio depend on the text being sufficiently univocal that they can draw on strands from the outer and miscellaneous chapters to support their points, which is legitimized by the very idea that the text forms some kind of whole -- an idea with which these disparate threads are in conflict.

Moeller and D'Ambrosio admit that the unity of a text like this one should be understood not as presenting a single statement or doctrine, but rather as presenting a way of life (14). This way of life might have the unity, perhaps, of one thinker's development over a lifetime, or of a gathering of thinkers whose ideas are sympathetic to each other. The problem, of course, given the dearth of information about this person or group, is to demonstrate some essential coherence in the way of life expressed in the text itself -- or to demonstrate that some parts do not belong. This interpretation has not fully achieved the first task, and explicitly does not attempt the second.

Moeller and D'Ambrosio suggest that the humoristic key in which they read the text can integrate contradictory strands (11), insofar as it does not require reading the text as endorsing any particular ideas. But there does nevertheless still seem to be a conflict between the earnest advice given in the chapters mentioned above, and the claim, or way of reading that claim, that nothing is endorsed but the value of recognizing contingency.

These critical comments, while they may present genuine difficulties for this interpretation of the Zhuangzi, do not negate its importance. Rather, they represent moves in what must be a continuing dialogue about the interpretation of this rich and polysemous text. In any case, this book is one to which I will return for its insights into the Zhuangzi and its place in traditional and contemporary thought.