Geometric Possibility

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Gordon Belot, Geometric Possibility, Oxford University Press, 2011, 219pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199595327.

Reviewed by Carolyn Brighouse, Occidental College


Belot explores a central metaphysical question concerning the ontology of space. Much has been written about the substantivalist / relationalist controversy; Belot's book provides a new take on it. He is concerned with how a relationalist can make sense of claims that the world has a particular geometric structure. For ease of exposition he restricts attention to the geometry of space rather than spacetime. A substantival world has the geometric structure it has because of the geometric relations that hold between the points (or regions) of space. The geometric structure of a relational world must come from the geometric relations instantiated by objects, or, as Belot puts it, from its material geometry. However, in all but those worlds in which matter forms a plenum the information encoded in a world's material geometry looks like it would fall short of determining the information encoded in the geometry of substantival space.

Belot's book explores whether and when this is true: What resources can the relationalist muster in order to be able to adequately match the substantivalist's ability to talk of the geometric structure of the world? And, can a relationalist position that adequately matches the substantivalist's geometric talk be defended? As Belot warns in an appendix, those readers motivated to reject relationalism in virtue of its baroque ontology should not expect a revelation upon reading the book; Belot's approach here explicitly rejects the idea that simplicity considerations give us good evidence for metaphysical positions. Quite apart from its appeal as a book that contains some wonderful and witty philosophical analysis, it is readable just for its lovely exposition of examples from geometry. It has something for almost everyone and ought to be a staple for philosophers interested in philosophy of space and time, metaphysics, philosophy of physics, or geometry.

Belot starts by trying to get a handle on just what the possible geometric structures of space are. Admitting that this question is a little slippery, he urges that our intuitions guide us in the direction of some suitable generalization of Euclidean geometry, and in chapter one takes us on a highlight-filled tour of mathematical structures that could provide that generalization. His own view is that the right class of structures is the class of metric spaces. But after illustrating just how wild and weird such spaces can be, he assures us that just taking a tamer subclass of metric spaces to represent the possible geometric structures of space will be sufficient for the main arguments of the book, while making it clear that one would be hard pressed to provide well motivated criteria to settle on a tamer subclass of metric spaces. As any good tour guide would, he points out the areas where those with special metaphysical interests will want to linger. Moreover, importantly for Belot, taking the class of metric spaces to represent the class of possible geometries doesn't commit one to any particular view about what the fundamental geometric properties are at any possible world. At most it commits one to thinking that the fundamental geometric properties at a world determine facts about distances consistent with a single metric space structure (up to a scale factor) (p. 32).

The question is slippery. For Belot, contrary to many popular approaches to metaphysics, our intuitions about the possible geometries of space are not straightforwardly derived from physics. He thinks that there is a brand of metaphysical possibility here that may outstrip physical possibility: some geometric structures are ways that space could be, even if they are not geometric structures that any physical theory (at least that we know of) countenances as possible. But he's not totally at odds with the popular: he thinks that for any possible geometry that space could have, some physics could be cooked up to work in that space (presumably even in the most wild and weird ones). One's intuitions about what counts as a possible geometry of space are also being probed in a way that ignores one's views about the fundamental ontology of space, and to this a relationalist might want to lodge a complaint: it seems strange that we can arrive at a conclusion about what the possible structures for X are independent of our views about what the nature of X is. Having said this, there seems something fundamentally compelling about taking the class of possible geometries of space to be representable by at most the full class of metric spaces, and, while it would be nice to see a clearer justification, it's all Belot needs here.

The second chapter details the options for the relationalist. Conservative relationalists think that the geometric structure of space is fully revealed by the actual configurations of matter, while for modal relationalists the geometric structure is only fully revealed by its actual and possible configurations. Belot's money is on the modal relationalist; he argues that the prospects are dim for conservative relationalists. Even for very simple relationalistically friendly worlds he shows that the conservative relationalist has difficulty providing a coherent account of geometric structure. The modal relationalist approach, Belot claims, has roots in Leibniz (and for those readers requiring textual support for this claim Belot gives it and argues for it thoroughly -- and learnedly -- in an appendix). On this approach the relationalist has to articulate a brand of geometric possibility. Is the notion primitive or grounded in the intrinsic geometric properties instantiated at a world? If grounded, are the intrinsic geometric properties at a world distance relations between bits of matter? Metric relationalists say "yes". And, how much of the substantivalist geometric discourse is to be captured? Ambitious relationalists say "all": for any substantival world their goal is to find a relationalist world for which the same geometric modal claims are true. But any relationalist with hopes of having it all has a problem: Imagine a world empty but for a single particle. The substantivalist will undoubtedly think that such a particle could lie in a world with the structure of Euclidean n-space, for at least any finite n, or hyperbolic n-space. Such examples illustrate that ambition, groundedness, and metricity are not going to be cotenable for any modal relationalist. The rest of the book provides a careful articulation and assessment of three modal relationalist positions that give up on ambition, groundedness, and metricity respectively. The array of positions that unfold have analogues in the debate about nomic possibility, and the exposition is informed by Belot's discussion of the analogies.

Modal relationalists giving up on ambition can adapt a Lewis-style best-system approach to nomic possibility to their needs. Belot articulates a best-system relationalism inspired by a version due to Nick Huggett. A geometry for a world, w, is a metric space (X,d) that contains a subset isometric to the material configuration of w. A geometry is ideal if it achieves an undominated balance of simplicity and strength, and a pattern of distance relations is geometrically possible relative to w if it is instantiated in each ideal geometry for w. Simplicity and strength must be cashed out differently than in the nomic case, but we have intuitions that can inform us when it comes to the relative simplicity of various geometries, and Belot proposes a natural way to cash out strength for metric spaces (p. 60). But he points out that just the kinds of worries that arise in the nomic case can be motivated more precisely, and compellingly, here. To do its job there ought to be a single coherent global notion of geometric simplicity. But when faced with even the four classical geometries, those metric spaces that seem to us very friendly and tame, different geometers have had widely divergent views on their relative simplicity by bringing to bear different syntactic or geometric criteria for their judgments. A notion of balance ought to be invariant across ideal rational creatures for geometric possibility to have the right status, but Belot gives compelling examples that cast doubt both on this and on the hope that the right balance of simplicity and strength will pop out a unique ideal geometry. And, while the best-systems relationalist has given up on ambition, Belot has an array of examples in which multiple geometries are apparently compatible with the same set of material configurations. These examples feed our intuitions toward ambition and show that supervenience can be maintained by the best-systems relationalist -- but only at the cost of dogged, and to Belot's mind, purely philosophically motivated unambitiousness.

If the modal relationalist wants to hold onto ambition and metricity, she can attempt to do so by giving up on groundedness. In chapter four Belot explores the prospects for relationalists so inspired who adopt a primitive notion of geometric possibility. The exact form such modal relationalism will take depends on how much recovery of the substantivalist geometric discourse is demanded by ambition. A simple approach is to adopt a mirror principle demanding that whenever a substantival world w exists with material configuration C there is a relationalist world w* with material configuration C* (that instantiates the same pattern of distance relations as C) and W and W* agree about which patterns of distance relations among material points are geometrically possible. The trick for the primitive relationalist is to take the notions of a full relationalist world and an accessibility relation G on the space of possible relationalist worlds as primitive. If she then postulates that to each metric space there corresponds a full relationalist world and lays down further postulates stipulating when non-full worlds exhibit the same geometry as full ones, she can satisfy the mirror principle. Give her a substantivalist world w with material configuration C and she'll be able to find a relationalist world w* with material configuration C* (isometric to C) via a sub-spacing detour through the full relationalist world corresponding to w, and these worlds will agree on the geometrically possible patterns of distance relations between material points. But this simple strategy doesn't go far enough. There are myriad situations in which knowing the pattern of distance relations between material points does not tell you all the geometric facts at a world: knowing the distance between two material points on the surface of a cylinder does not tell you where on that surface they lie. Does the line joining them point along the axis? Or run around the surface perpendicular to the axis? In inhomogeneous or anisotropic spaces (and even in the elliptical plane) material configurations may instantiate the same distance relations (be congruent) but play different roles in the space (not be superposable); just how widespread is this failure is the topic of a tantalizing appendix. Belot elegantly shows how to patch up the primitivist position to deal with such cases and convincingly argues that a careful primitivist armed with the notion of a full relationalist world should be able to match the substantivalist move for move even in the wildest metric spaces.

But Belot is not happy with the primitivist strategy. To his mind, once we see that there are spaces in which distance relations between material configurations don't determine all the geometric facts, the motivation for metricity is undermined. Nor should we be inspired to rearm the primitivist with just congruence and betweenness relations, for in some spaces non-quantitative facts about congruence and betweenness fail to determine distance relations. Attractive primitivism would take different relations to be fundamental at different worlds, and Belot illustrates how this might go. He sees the fundamental geometric properties instantiated at a world as shown to us by the primitives used in the axiomatization of the corresponding metric space. Metric spaces axiomatizable using different primitives show us that some worlds with that geometry have the primitives of one axiomatization as their fundamental geometric properties while others have the primitives of the other (and still others might have the primitives of both). In fact the concern about metricity has reach against any metric relationalist. And it brings to the fore a question that readers might have in mind throughout the book: just what are the fundamental geometric properties at a world? And how exactly should a relationalist approach this question?

The last position Belot considers is modeled on the necessitarian approach to laws. Its aim is grounded, ambitious, non-metric relationalism. Necessitarians about laws see laws as grounded in the fundamental intrinsic properties instantiated at a world; the necessitarian relationalist will see geometric possibility as being so grounded. The trick is to figure out just what kinds of properties these would have to be. Belot invokes compatibility properties: an object has the property of being compatible with property p just in case there is a duplicate of that object at a world in which p is instantiated. In the nomic case, with the right kinds of constraints on the class of possible worlds, we get information about the laws of nature from compatibility properties. The necessitarian relationalist can take the geometric facts at a relationalist world to be given by the distance relations between material points and the compatibility properties of the regions (defined as mereological sums of material points).

Roughly we proceed as follows: we define when a world is full, and we stipulate that at full worlds all geometric facts supervene on metric properties and that for any metric space there is a full relationalist world instantiating the geometry of that space. Then we describe how the intrinsic geometric properties at a relationalist world arise from those of full worlds: for any region R of a full world w there is a relationalist world w' whose material configuration is a geometric duplicate of R, and now in w' our intrinsic properties will include not only the metric properties of the region R but the compatibility properties that R had in the full world also. Now we have secured grounded ambition: a single particle relationalist world wE3 with the geometry of Euclidean 3-space is possible, as is a single particle world wS with the geometry of the sphere. While the particles in these worlds have the same metric properties, they have different compatibility properties: the particle in wE3 has the property that it is compatible with any material configuration with the geometry of Euclidean 3-space, while the particle in wS is compatible with just material configurations of the sphere.

The concern Belot raises for the necessitarian relationalist is whether the position is sufficiently grounded: does the supervenience base consist of properties that are themselves non-modal? And in this respect does the other grounded relationalism, the best-systems relationalist, enjoy an advantage? Belot argues that in the nomic case the most attractive way to deal with this invokes non-modal essential properties, and he argues that this is available to the necessitarian. In the geometric case, however, things get murkier. Belot argues that the properties that encode information about the structure of space look as non-modal for the best-systems relationalist as for the necessitarian relationalist, but compatibility properties sure seem to encode a whole lot of information about possible non-actual configurations of matter independent of the spatial geometry: it's these that will determine in a relationalist two point elliptical plane world whether a third point can be placed collinearly or not. As Belot notes,in the case of the elliptical plane we could have chosen to use the non-modal property of collinearity instead to do this work, and so the compatibility properties, while modal looking, are not encoding modal information in this case -- they are eliminable. But this case is just the tip of the iceberg: as Belot disclaims, in the wild and weird possible geometries of space who knows if this will always be true.

Where does this leave the relationalist? For Belot the front runner is necessitarian relationalism; it enjoys ambition and a rejection of metricity over the best-systems approach, and by not taking any modal notion as primitive enjoys an advantage over even the non-metric primitive approach. Plus, it encourages us to explore the full class of metric spaces in search of an answer to the question of what the fundamental geometric properties at a world are. Metaphysically brilliant it is; simple it is not. But as long as the relationalist is committed to taking even a fairly tame subclass of metric spaces as representing the possible geometries of space, simplicity seems a vain hope.

Relationalists reading Belot's book should be encouraged to think long and hard about how their relationalism should inform their views about possible geometries of space and fundamental geometric properties. Signing up for one of the Belot-relationalisms involves special commitments here, and a cautious relationalist ought to make sure that she can argue for these commitments in a way that is informed by her ontology. Substantivalists reading the book might well feel vindicated.