German Idealism and the Concept of Punishment

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Jean-Christophe Merle, German Idealism and the Concept of Punishment, Joseph J. Kominkiewicz with Jean-Christophe Merle and Frances Brown (trs.), Cambridge UP, 2009, 207pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521886840.

Reviewed by Timothy Brownlee, Xavier University



Jean-Christophe Merle’s aim in German Idealism and the Concept of Punishment is twofold. First, he presents a novel interpretation of the accounts of punishment that we find in the practical writings of Kant, Fichte, and Hegel. At the same time, Merle’s book constitutes a sustained criticism of retributivist theories of punishment. The work’s thematic unity stems from Merle’s advocacy of the view that the true aim and justification of punishment lies neither in utilitarian general deterrence nor in deontological retributivism, but rather in “specific deterrence” or the “rehabilitation” of the criminal. While rehabilitation shares with retribution the claim that crime is a necessary condition for punishment, rehabilitation rejects the idea of a simple equivalence between crime and punishment. However, most significantly, Merle argues that the rehabilitation theory that he claims to find in the writings of Kant and his respondents does a better job of delivering on one of the central commitments of retributivism, namely the demand that punishment respect the dignity of the criminal. According to Merle “It is not retributivism, but instead solely rehabilitation, that takes the responsibility truly seriously that a human being — and especially a criminal — has for his or her actions” (13). Since that responsibility "is actually what constitutes the special status of human beings (their dignitas)," only rehabilitation acknowledges and shows respect for the criminal as a human being (6).

The suggestion that Kant, Fichte, and Hegel advocate a non-retributivist position certainly contradicts the interpretive orthodoxy. However, Merle claims that Kant does a poor job of arguing for retributivism, and that retributivism is in fact inconsistent with Kant’s concept of right. Instead, Merle argues that we find the historical foundation for a theory of punishment as specific deterrence or rehabilitation in Kant’s conception of right, and that it is Fichte and Hegel who “reconstructed what should have been Kant’s theory of punishment” (83). While grounded in a careful textual interpretation, Merle’s conclusions are also tightly argued and he certainly succeeds in raising significant doubts concerning retributivist interpretations of German idealist theories of punishment. While clearly important for scholars of the history of German idealism, Merle’s book will also be of interest to those interested in the history and justification of punishment, especially philosophers of law, and historians of ethics and political philosophy.

Part I of the book concerns Kant’s treatment of punishment. Of course, Merle acknowledges that Kant’s explicit discussions of punishment favor retributivism. It is well-known that Kant’s insistence on the lex talionis as the central principle of punishment demands, for example, the death penalty for murderers, regardless of the effects that arise directly from the punishment.1 In recent years, interpreters have worked to dull the edge of Kant’s retributivism by arguing that Kant’s theory of punishment is in fact a “hybrid” theory, including both a retributivist and a general deterrent element. Merle argues against both interpretive strategies. He consistently holds that hybrid theories of punishment only appear to find a complementary relation between retribution and general deterrence. Such allegedly hybrid theories either prove incoherent — retributivism and deterrence "are incompatible with one another" (12) — or show that they are, in actuality, completely grounded in either deterrence or retribution. At the same time, while he acknowledges that Kant’s explicit accounts of punishment in the Rechtslehre appeal to the principle of retribution (“Kant is not only a central figure in retributivism, but also its founding father” 21), Merle contends that Kant’s arguments in favor of that principle are weak. In particular, Merle argues that Kant never successfully grounds retributivism in his concept of right, and that retributivism is, in fact, incompatible with that concept.

Kant identifies “right” as "the sum of the conditions under which the choice (Willkür) of one can be united with the choice of another in accordance with a universal law of freedom."2 Merle acknowledges that this concept admits of at least two significant interpretations. Interpreters like Otfried Höffe and Thomas Pogge have argued for a “liberal” interpretation of right, according to which the concept does not concern the content of individual choice. Merle also identifies a “moral” interpretation of right, according to which the aim of right is to promote the implementation of the categorical imperative as the principle governing the individual’s choice by means of the coercive apparatus of the law. However, he argues that neither interpretation of the concept of right can support retributivism. With regard to the liberal interpretation, Merle stresses that Kant makes no attempt to “deduce” ius talionis from the principle of right, and that retribution ultimately contradicts the concept of right since it does not take sufficient account of the freedom of all, notably excluding the freedom of the criminal. With regard to the moral interpretation of the concept of right, Merle argues that retributive punishment does not promote the highest moral good, as Kant describes it in the second Critique. Rather, Merle argues that Kant’s endorsements of moral retribution are limited to the “noumenal world” and that, in the phenomenal world, the appropriate domain of the legal system, the highest moral good “requires forgiveness toward the criminal as long as this forgiveness is compatible with the concern for the safety of the other citizens” (187).

Irrespective of the particular use to which he puts it in addressing Kant’s justification of punishment, Merle’s interpretation of the concept of right should prove valuable to scholars of Kant’s practical philosophy. The specific status of the concept of right within the Metaphysics of Morals has come to be significant in recent years, in particular for interpreters like Höffe and Pogge, who have argued that the Rechtslehre constitutes an important precursor to contemporary political liberalism. However, Merle’s account of right would be strengthened by a more careful consideration of the question of what the concept of right has to do with morality. While Merle claims that Kant derives both the doctrine of right and the doctrine of virtue from the categorical imperative, Merle does not consider the view of liberal interpreters like Allen Wood, who have recently questioned this attempt to find unity within the Metaphysics of Morals by identifying a common role for the categorical imperative (27).3

While retributivism therefore contradicts both interpretations of Kant’s concept of right, Merle argues that we can reconstruct a properly Kantian theory of punishment on the basis of the concept of right. That theory of punishment, however, aims both at specific deterrence (preventing the criminal from re-offending) and, ultimately, rehabilitation. While Merle sketches a theory of punishment as rehabilitation on the basis of Kant’s practical writings, he argues in Part II that Fichte and Hegel actually “develop similar consequences to those that Kant … should have logically drawn,” and that both explicitly ground their arguments for punishment in concepts of specific deterrence and rehabilitation (14).

On this score, too, Merle’s position contradicts the interpretive orthodoxy. While Merle acknowledges that both Fichte and Hegel countenance some form of retributivism, he argues that neither advocates retributivism to justify punishment. Rather, both employ talion law in accounting for the appropriate degree of punishment. Both, however, criticize the suggestion that retribution constitutes the justification of punishment. For Fichte, crime constitutes a breach of the social contract on the part of the criminal and punishment is the means by which the terms of that contract are restored. Specifically, the criminal enters into an “expiation contract” with the state, by means of which he accepts a specific punishment instead of being permanently excluded from the commonwealth (102). According to Merle, this expiation contract is justified by neither general deterrence (which would be better accomplished through permanent expulsion) nor retribution (since the term of the punishment can exceed what talion law would require). Even though it is initially introduced as a secondary criterion for punishment, rehabilitation or the reform of the criminal is the ultimate aim of punishment and the one most consistent with the demands of right. As he did in considering Kant’s position, Merle rejects attempts to portray Hegel’s theory of punishment as a hybrid incorporating both a retributivist element (found in the account of “Abstract Right” in the Philosophy of Right) and a deterrent element (found in the discussion of “Ethical Life”).

On Merle’s reading, Hegel contends that the aim of punishment should be the “restoration of right” which is undermined through crime (126). Since, for Hegel, right is simply the realization of the freedom of the will, talion law fails to restore right because it fails to treat the criminal as “an existence of freedom” (128). The primary aim of punishment is to have a specific effect on the will of the criminal, namely to reassert, in the eyes of the criminal, the demands of right that his crime has undermined. While Merle acknowledges Hegel’s endorsement of some role for talion law, he stresses that retaliation plays no role in Hegel’s justification of punishment. Rather, as it was for Fichte, talion law is a helpful means for accomplishing the appropriate end and justification of punishment, namely specific deterrence and rehabilitation, since “talion law is, according to Hegel, what everyone, and therefore the criminal as well, can sense the most” (142).

While Parts I and II trace a clear historical and argumentative trajectory, Part III does not fit as simply within the narrative that Merle identifies in German idealism. In Part III, Merle first attempts to identify the essential elements of a Nietzschean theory of punishment on the basis of a reading of the Genealogy of Morality. Stressing Nietzsche’s view that, historically, retributivism is not rooted in a respect for the dignity of the criminal, but rather in an instinct of cruelty, Merle claims that Nietzsche shows us that retributive punishment is ineffective in instilling in the criminal a feeling of guilt for her action, and does little to curb recidivism — aims which would be much better accomplished through a penal practice aimed at specific deterrence and rehabilitation. Merle next turns to the problem that punishment of crimes against humanity seems to pose for his view that the aim of punishment should be rehabilitation. Merle contends that, in spite of the fact that crimes against humanity possess a special status as crimes against “the basic political institutions of states governed by the rule of law,” rehabilitation would counsel “more lenient punishments” for crimes against humanity than for ordinary individual crimes, since, in many cases, the perpetrators of such crimes will have already been reintegrated into society, and will be at a low risk to re-offend (176, 182). While “popular sentiment” might demand retribution for crimes against humanity, Merle argues that the moral “monstrousness” of such acts cannot provide a special justification for their severe punishment. Having shown that his theory of punishment as rehabilitation can accommodate tough cases like crimes against humanity, Merle concludes by making some specific suggestions for reform of penal practice in light of this theory.

Merle’s book succeeds in providing a tightly argued and carefully considered rejection of the prevailing retributivist and hybrid interpretations of German idealist theories of punishment. Merle’s work is anchored in an impressive familiarity and facility with contemporary German and English language scholarship on the issue. The translation of this often technical and heavily argumentative study is, in general, quite readable. Moreover, given its relatively short length, Merle should be credited for the economy with which he considers a diverse range of historical issues, and defends his own account of punishment as rehabilitation.

In one sense, the dual aim of Merle’s book is a reason for praise. That is, Merle does significant work to show how his historical account of German idealist theories of punishment constitutes a significant contribution to the contemporary conversation concerning the aim and justification of penal practice. However, there is an important sense in which this dual aim could have been better accomplished by improvements to both Merle’s interpretation of his historical sources and his account of punishment as rehabilitation.

On the historical front, Merle’s accounts of Fichte, Hegel, and Nietzsche would be improved if he gave more sustained attention to the generic aims of the works within which each thinker considers the problem of punishment, rather than simply situating his own interpretation in relation to the contemporary literature. For example, while Merle focuses his interpretation of Hegel’s justification of punishment on the discussion of “Abstract Right” in the Philosophy of Right, it is far from clear that Hegel took himself to have completely addressed the problem in that text alone. Within the dialectic of “abstract right,” crime announces a problem that ultimately prompts the abandonment of the standpoint of abstract right itself (specifically, crime shows that the individual can freely act from her own “particular” motives and interests and thereby undermine the conditions necessary for the freedom of other individuals, which are to be protected by the “universal” demands of right). This conflict between universality and particularity is only resolved in the context of “Ethical Life,” which is supposed to reconcile the universality of right with the particularity of the subject, and Hegel returns to the problem of crime and its punishment in his discussion of “Civil Society” (one of the three central spheres of modern ethical life). Even if Merle is correct in his assertion that, for Hegel, the aim of punishment is to be a “restoration of right,” this restoration should be not only possible but also actual within a specific set of institutions and practices within ethical life, since ethical life too is supposed to constitute a configuration of right.4 Merle’s interpretation of Hegel’s theory of punishment (and, I think, Fichte and Nietzsche’s too) would be improved by more specific attention the overall aims of the works within which each considers the problem of punishment.

While more interpretive work would strengthen the historical conclusions for which Merle argues, his account of punishment as rehabilitation would benefit from more careful engagement with contemporary rehabilitation theorists, and a more detailed account of how rehabilitation could be justified and undertaken within modern legal institutions.5 Absent further clarification and explanation, there seems to be a significant problem with Merle’s account of punishment as rehabilitation. In particular, it is not clear how Merle’s liberal (and non-moral) account of law can accommodate the aim of rehabilitation. That is, a system of penal law which concerns only “the observance of the laws or … the infringement of right” and not the “(purely moral) wickedness” of the criminal would seem to legitimate only specific deterrence, for example in the form of the incarceration of the criminal to prevent her from (at least immediately) re-offending (191). However, as Merle acknowledges, measures like incarceration, which can be legitimated by appeal to specific deterrence, do not necessarily promote the aim of rehabilitation, which, it would seem, requires more than actually coercing the criminal so that he is unable to re-offend. A criminal who has been rehabilitated would have to come to acknowledge for herself that the demands of law are legitimately binding on her conduct, and freely choose not to re-offend. That is, rehabilitation seems to require that the state influence not only the behavior but the free choice of the criminal, so that the criminal comes to identify obeying the law and respecting the demands of right as good, even if only conditionally good, in the sense that lawful behavior precludes the possibility of undesirable punishment. However, if Merle agrees with liberal interpreters of Kant, rehabilitation seems to demand that the state overstep precisely the limitation that was to limit right and distinguish it from morality. In any case, Merle’s account of punishment as rehabilitation would be strengthened by a further articulation of exactly what rehabilitation requires and a clearer account of its distinctness from specific deterrence.

In spite of these points for improvement, Merle’s account of the theory of punishment in German idealism is both engaging and challenging, and his book constitutes a significant and unorthodox contribution to an already lively historical discussion with important contemporary consequences.

1 According to Kant,

Even if a civil society were to be dissolved by the consent of all its members (e.g., if a people inhabiting an island decided to separate and disperse throughout the world), the last murderer remaining in prison would first have to be executed, so that each has done to him what his deeds deserve and blood guilt does not cling to the people for not having insisted upon this punishment; for otherwise the people can be regarded as collaborators in this public violation of justice. (Immanuel Kant, The Metaphysics of Morals in Practical Philosophy, ed. and trans. Mary J. Gregor [New York: Cambridge UP, 1999], p. 474.)

2 Kant, Metaphysics of Morals, p. 387.

3 Wood argues that right and the juridical duties grounded in it do not follow from the principle of morality, the categorical imperative, and that, while it does imply the value of certain moral ideas — such as respect for humanity — right rather identifies a “sphere” that is “independent of morality” (Allen Wood, Kant’s Ethical Thought [New York: Cambridge UP, 1999], pp. 322-323).

4 Merle’s interpretation of Nietzsche suffers from a similar problem. Merle does not succeed in showing that we can reconstruct “Nietzsche’s” theory of punishment on the basis of a reading of a few paragraphs in the Genealogy of Morality, in which Nietzsche seems only to be considering the historical genesis and development of penal practice. After all, Nietzsche concludes his discussion of punishment by pointing out that an examination of that history can provide us with a justification of nearly every theory of punishment we might want to endorse. See Friedrich Nietzsche, Zur Genealogie der Moral in KSA 5, §II.13, pp. 316-318.

5 Merle largely neglects the recent literature on rehabilitation theories of punishment. For those interested, Jeffrie G. Murphy’s well-known reader would likely be a good place to begin. See Murphy, ed. Punishment and Rehabilitation, 3rd Ed. (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1995).