Gilles Deleuze: An Introduction

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Todd May, Gilles Deleuze: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 196 pp., $21.99 (pbk.), ISBN 0521603846.

Reviewed by Keith Ansell Pearson, University of Warwick


In spite of their difficult and often obscure character, the writings of Gilles Deleuze (1925-95) are now widely recognised as constituting one of the most innovative projects in philosophy to have emerged in the second half of the twentieth century. Deleuze is admired for his thought-provoking interpretations of some key figures in modern philosophy such as Hume, Nietzsche, and Spinoza, for resurrecting interest in the unjustly neglected contributions of Bergson, whilst his collaborations with Felix Guattari are currently exerting an influence, for good or ill, on intellectual activity and cultural practices well outside the bounds of the academy. But just what kind of philosopher is Deleuze? And what are we to make of his innovations in philosophy? Deleuze appears as an alien and exotic plant in the landscape of twentieth-century philosophy. He was a figure who refused to pay obeisance to many of its established orthodoxies. But there is much we still don't adequately understand about Deleuze, perhaps the most important things, including, for example, the nature of his relation to phenomenology (Deleuze's beginnings lie in Sartre), the nature of his novel empiricism (his first book of 1953 was on Hume), and the decisions he took with respect to the tasks of philosophy in his highly inventive readings of Spinoza, Nietzsche, and Bergson. Deleuze is a difficult philosopher to position and to get the measure of. He read the three figures just mentioned as "superior" empiricists; he once said that what attracted to him about Bergson's work was the fact that it features both a radical materialism and a pure spiritualism; and in his great work of the 1960s, Difference and Repetition, he outlines a transcendental empiricism that is novel but also elusive, and that then gets transmuted into something that calls itself "transcendental materialism" in Anti-Oedipus. Deleuze constantly re-invented the nature and terms of his thinking, making a series of decisions with respect to key concepts and constructions, but rarely made it explicit that he was doing this. In A Thousand Plateaus (1980) he encourages his readers to practice "pop philosophy" and "to write with slogans". A decade later in What is Philosophy? (1991) something much more severe is now being called for as Deleuze seeks to reclaim the creation of concepts from our post-modern designers and social engineers. Although Deleuze's work opens up new lines of thought, the specific nature of his philosophical practice, including the nature of the decisions he took, remains poorly understood.

Todd May has been one of the leading commentators on Deleuze in the English-speaking world for over a decade now, and one of the most helpful. In this new book on Deleuze, offered as an introduction, he has chosen not to address critical issues surrounding Deleuze's work and our reception of it (he had aired some critical points about Deleuze in his book on Foucault of 1993, Between Genealogy and Epistemology). Instead, he applies himself to the needs of readers new to Deleuze, seeking to bring out the novel possibilities of thought and life that we encounter in Deleuze's writings. The book is divided into five core chapters. Chapter one opens with the question that serves to steer the book as a whole, "How Might One Live?" May raises this as a normative question about possibility: however it is we are living, how might we live otherwise? He suggests that the raising of this question is a distinctive feature of the so-called tradition of "continental" philosophy, in contrast to the analytic tradition which, he claims, ridicules normative concerns since it holds that this is not to engage in "hard" philosophy (a characterisation, I am sure, that many practitioners of analytic philosophy would contest and regard as outdated). Even with respect to core thinkers in the continental tradition, May detects a tendency towards specialisation that blunts the power of the larger questions. Chapter two covers Deleuze's investment in the ideas of his "holy trinity", Spinoza, Bergson, and Nietzsche, and helpfully focuses on the three topics Deleuze extracts from each thinker and puts to novel use in his writings: immanence (including the thesis on the univocity of being), duration, and affirmation. Chapter three is on "Thought, Science, and Language", and explores the rapport between work in science and Deleuze's conception of the tasks of philosophy. This chapter also contains a set of helpful insights into Deleuze's logic of sense and thinking on language. Chapter four is on "The Politics of Difference" and essentially offers an illuminating treatment of a Deleuzian-inspired criticism of liberal political theory. Chapter five, entitled "Lives", is a short concluding chapter in which, in a series of vignettes on John Coltrane's sax playing, the intifada, the modern city, and the erotics of love, the author seeks to demonstrate the force and range of Deleuzian thinking. May's overriding aim is to expose the new reader to this powerful force in contemporary philosophy. He essentially does this by seeking to show what learning to think consists in, including the relinquishing of all the bad habits that have been installed in us by common sense and good sense and the representational view of language and the world. Then we must learn to think anew by conjugating our thought and world, our thought and language. I am not the one to say whether or not May has succeeded in this effort (the book has not been written for someone like me), but I very much admire the author's commitment to the creative pedagogy of thought.

For May, what Deleuze is essentially about as a philosopher is securing an ontology that can be adequate to the task of learning how we might live in the space-time of our future possibilities. To help the reader gain an effective sense of the question of how one might live May calls upon Nietzsche and his insight into the event of the death of God. This death signals the end of transcendence, and on the ethical plane necessitates a change of perspective, away from the question "how should we act?" to that of "how might we live?", in which the stress is now placed on possibilities of living that can only assume the form and style of a radical experimentation, "allowing us to enlarge our lives beyond the limits our history had set for us" (p. 7). There is no longer any transcendent agent or power to which we are answerable and through which we can install a system of judgement. We now undergo and are free to experiment with what Deleuze calls "the vertigo of immanence". As May rightly insists, this new freedom is taken by us to be something both frightening and promising; it is a monstrous kind of promise (which for Derrida is the definition of the promise of that which is to-come).

In the book's opening chapter May highlights the challenge Deleuze poses for philosophy. For Deleuze the practice of philosophy is neither motivated by knowing nor inspired by truth; rather it is the categories of the Interesting, the Remarkable, or the Important that determines its success or failure. On this May comments: "The destiny of philosophical concepts and philosophical positions lie not with truth or falsity of their claims but with the vistas for thinking and living they open up for us" (p. 22). It's not a matter of the extension and expansion of our knowledge but of perception, opening up new ways of seeing the world and existence (although much of this may make Deleuze sound close to a figure like Rorty, the latter's project remains bound up with common sense and good sense).

May chooses to highlight the distinctive character of Deleuze's philosophical practice not by focusing on his novel empiricism -- the best place to start in my view -- but rather by drawing attention to Deleuze's commitment to ontology. As he rightly notes, this is an aspect of Deleuze that makes him a quite different kind of philosopher from his contemporaries and close associates such as Derrida and Foucault. Neither was concerned with the fate of ontology; indeed both were suspicious of it. As May points out Deleuze's works, by contrast, are steeped in ontology. His world is one in which new entities and new forms of life proliferate, including pre-individual singularities, desiring-machines, transversal affects, becomings-animal, molecular, woman, and so on. Ontology for Deleuze, says May, need not work to constrain our possibilities by dictating our limits, as Derrida and Foucault suspected. May insists that giving up on the idea that ontology is bound up with the discovery and recognition of identities does not result in philosophy simply giving itself over to fiction and fantasy. Philosophy remains subject to constraining forces, and in the case of Deleuze's practice this is centred on the creation of concepts upon a "plane of immanence". Here the task of philosophy is conceived as one of creating concepts for difference, showing that behind everything there is difference and behind difference there is nothing. A distinction is made between knowledge and thought, with the former bound to the understanding of identities, the latter moving beyond what is known to the difference beneath and behind what is taken to be the known (p. 21). May claims that Deleuze's commitment to ontology does not suppose that there is anything to discover about the nature of the entities that populate the universe, since there is always only ever creation, as opposed to simple discovery (p. 17). This is why Deleuzian ontology cannot be construed as an affair of knowledge conceived as that which involves the recognition and understanding of what exists in terms of identities. Philosophy, then, is inspired neither by truth nor by fiction but rather devotes itself to creating new modes of perception and sensation that disturb our verities. Ontology's investment in difference does not seek to articulate a truth but rather, the author states, to create "a perspective on what there is" (p. 22).

As an introduction May's book offers numerous helpful insights into the many novel aspects of Deleuze's thinking. It is especially good in showing how within Deleuze's conception of philosophy it is illegitimate to restrict thinking to the human being and its temporal being in the world (indeed one might suggest that Deleuze's ontology is also a cosmology). May's belief that a Deleuzian ontology can take us beyond a tired post-modern conformism and our intellectual laziness is one that many readers will appreciate and be inspired by. My main criticism of the book is that it does not allow space for the reader to pause for thought and pose some critical questions of Deleuze's remarkable conception of philosophy. Such questions need posing not because one has a primary unearned commitment to scepticism or indifference, but because the stakes for the cause of thinking are so high. Take, for example, the striking claim that thought is not guided by truth and has no essential investment in it. It's unclear why one cannot retort to such a claim by pointing out that "truth" -- conceived as the event of an evolution, a history, a becoming (as it is in Nietzsche and Foucault, for example) -- can be something "interesting", "remarkable" or "important"! When Nietzsche raises his specific and exacting question concerning truth -- to what extent can it stand incorporation? -- he is appealing to "truth" as that which challenges us precisely because it is bound up with that which lies outside recognition. The critical point May had leveled at Deleuze in his book on Foucault -- "Deleuze, like Nietzsche, longs for the purity of the wild state of things, and thus the object of his affirmation … is on the other side of reason", which is incisive about Deleuze but clearly misguided with respect to Nietzsche -- makes no appearance in this introduction. Perhaps May has changed his mind.

One of the most innovative aspects of Deleuze's philosophy is the way it seeks to reconstitute the transcendental field of possibility, away from any subject-object relation as its foundational ground, and in the direction of an immanent plane of pre-individual singularities and pre-human affects. What one wants to know and learn, however, is how this is done and what new difficulties it creates for our thought and existence. Why this move in the wake of the death of God and the end of transcendence? What compels us to it? On the issue of knowledge conceived on the model of recognition, could one not claim that modern practices of knowledge long ago relinquished a commitment to the understanding and recognition of identities? What remains of such identities in, for example, modern evolutionary theory, the theories of Relativity, or the microphysical indeterminacy of quantum mechanics? How can Deleuzian ontology compete with science with respect to that which lies behind and beneath when it foregoes the categories of the true and the false? To his immense credit May does address science in this book. In chapter three he notes that there are workers in contemporary science who do, in fact, conceive the world in ways that are compatible with Deleuze's view. The two are said to converge "on a new conception of the world and the universe in which we live: a world and a universe that may be more alive than we have been led to think" (p. 73; see also p. 86). Although this is welcome, May does not take into account the challenge scientific knowledge might present to the Deleuzian creation of concepts (one that offers itself as an empiricism of concepts) and put its experimentalism to the test. May claims that for Deleuze "living consists in difference and its actualization", noting that difference is not a thing but a process, adding, "It unfolds … It is alive", and it is alive, we are told, not with cells or respiration but with "vitality" (p. 24). One wishes to ask, what does it mean exactly to speak of "vitality"? What is this "unfolding" and what does it mean to say such unfolding (and refolding) is "alive"? What is the precise nature and status of the notion of "life" at work here? Part of the problem, as May notes in his excellent essay on Deleuze and science in Gary Gutting's edited collection Continental Philosophy of Science (Basil Blackwell 2005), is that Deleuze's philosophy and science both develop similar concepts and approaches. If this is the case, then it is incumbent upon Deleuze's commentators to ensure that the core notions, such as difference and the virtual, are defined as precisely as possible and shown to work. (Let me also note that in this essay May acknowledges that Deleuze's thinking retains a link with truth. He has obviously simplified the issue in this introduction).

There is much to admire in each chapter and much to admire about the book as a whole, not least the lucidity of its style and its openness to the possibilities of novel modes of philosophising. It is not an easy task to write an introduction to a philosopher's ideas and modes of thinking, especially one as complex and innovative as Deleuze. May's opening gambit is, on the whole, an effective way of provoking readers and drawing them into Deleuze's challenge; the decision to foreground Deleuze's revolution in ontology succeeds in showing what is distinctive about Deleuze as a so-called "postmodern" figure; whilst the attempt to show the pertinence of Deleuzian ontology to fields as diverse as science and politics is admirably done. My problem with the book is that there are too many times when it relies on overly general descriptions and characterisations, to the point where they mislead the reader and lack critical content. In addition, the presentation of key concepts and terms -- for example, the virtual, difference itself, and the plane of immanence -- is often done in highly imprecise and loose terms. On the one hand, I applaud May's attempt to write pedagogically and non-technically about Deleuze's ideas and concepts. On the other hand, however, I worry that his presentations make the Deleuzian revolution sound simpler than it really is or can be. However, let me finish this review by stressing that the book's core chapters work wonderfully well and, more often than not, May is a pleasure to read. I greatly welcome his introduction and applaud the seriousness of the author's philosophical commitment