Gilles Deleuze: Image and Text

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Eugene W. Holland, Daniel W. Smith, and Charles J. Stivale (eds.), Gilles Deleuze: Image and Text, Continuum, 2009, 276pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826439239.

Reviewed by Antonio Calcagno, The University of Western Ontario



Eugene Holland, Daniel Smith, and Charles Stivale, three leading Deleuze scholars, have collaborated to produce a much needed and excellent book that focuses on Deleuze’s work on art, film, image, text and literature as well as philosophy.1 The book is comprised of thirteen essays and includes an introduction by Holland. This collection stems from a conference originally held at the University of South Carolina from April 5-8, 2007, sponsored by the Program in Comparative Literature, the English Department and College of Arts and Sciences, and organized by Professor Paul Allen Miller. Featured in the text are essays by major Deleuze and Guattari scholars, including Constantin Boundas, Elizabeth Grosz, and Éric Alliez. Holland notes,

Deleuze was intensely interested in the medium of thought — interested in both individual styles of thought and in the various genres in which thought is conducted. For thought is by no means limited to philosophy alone: it also takes place — can also take place, in the right hands and under the right circumstances — in science, mathematics, literature, painting and cinema, to mention some of the genres or media of thought to which Deleuze most often refers. (1)

Faithful to Deleuze’s vision, the editors bring together scholars and artists to think about and extend Deleuze and Guattari’s specific philosophical legacy concerning the arts and philosophy. But this collection is more than expository, as the editors have arranged the essays so that they assist readers in seeing how key concepts in Deleuze can actualize themselves through different frameworks. Holland comments,

In this volume, we have grouped essays according to genre categories — literature, art, philosophy - but as we and the contributors understand Deleuze’s work, these categories intersect in an ongoing circulation of conceptual exchange… . We wish to introduce this volume by highlighting some of the transverse connections linking the essays via issues of representation, temporality, affect, sensation and counter-actualization. (2)

Part I, “Text and Literature,” opens with an essay by Ronald Bogue titled “The Landscape of Sensation.” Here, the author asks, “What is the relationship between texts and images in Deleuze’s conception of the arts?” (9) Bogue’s response consists of a conceptual (also a “physical, literal”) model where he grafts various arts onto Deleuzian concepts. He remarks:

We may thus construct the final composite model: (1) landscape, melodic landscape, respiration-space and skeleton-space, universe, cosmos, monochromatic field, deterritorialization; (2) House, structure, territory and (3) face, rhythmic characters, non-human becomings, figure. How might the various arts be situated in regard to this model? (19)

Unlike more traditional thinkers - one is reminded here of Lessing’s classifications of the arts — Deleuze and Guattari see various arts as drawing from all three concepts, but arts do not neatly identify with one or more of these categories. In the Deleuzian conception, the arts are always trying to overcome themselves, that is, they transcend both their techniques and traditional fields of representation. As such, they are always undoing themselves as they produce intense relations. Bogue successfully captures the schizophrenic nature of the arts and he examines the work of Beckett, Messiaen and others in order to show how one is to conceive concretely Deleuze’s view of the arts. Sometimes, it is hard to follow Bogue’s use of Deleuzian categories to qualify certain works of art, but this could be a result of the complexity and novelty of Deleuze’s ideas. One wonders, however, whether the Deleuzian view of the arts, with its emphasis on fluidity, becoming and degeneration, at least as Bogue presents it, can name, to employ a term from Badiou, any real, enduring concrete poetic or artistic event that radically changes and organizes the way we do art. In other words, apart from classifications and the blurring of borders, how do we explain true artistic interventions or events that have an enduring sense for generations that follow? One could argue, following Bogue, that Beckett, Pessoa, and Shakespeare are forms of literature that are unlike the cinema of de Sica and the music of Messiaen, but what about the artists’ unique and individuating, subjectivating, reality?

Chapter Two consists of an essay by Colin Gardner titled, “Bim Bam Bom Bem: ’Beckett’s Peehole’ as Audio-Visual Rhizome.” The author argues that since the publication of Deleuze and Guattari’s Kafka: Toward a Minor Literature in 1975, there has been a significant evaluation of Beckett’s oeuvre in light of the aforementioned work. Traditional readings of Beckett’s work view him as an existentialist racked with doubt and failure. (27) The Deleuzian and Guattarian concepts of the nomadic rhizome and machinic assemblages have permitted readers to see Beckett in a different light. Gardner shows how this is possible as Beckett leaves “only non-signifying intensities and deterritorialized flux.” (27). Rather than focusing on Becket’s texts, Gardner decides to look at Beckett through a 1995 televised German production of his work What Where, originally written in 1985. Here, we move from text to image, and this allows Gardner to discuss Beckett within the context of visual images, especially those invoked by cinema and cinema studies. The four characters of Beckett’s television adaptation, Bim, Bam, Bom, and Bem, are analyzed in terms of nomads that continuously undo speech and challenge what Deleuze would call a royal structure of interpretation. Gardner concludes,

If, as Deleuze has argued, the irrational apex of the modern post-war cinema is the ‘unsummonable of Welles, the undecidable of Resnais, the impossible of Marguerite Duras, or what might be called the incommensurable of Godard (between two things)’ … Beckett’s rhizomatic deterritorialization of language-as-space through exhaustion and a ‘punctuation of dehiscence’ would seem to be a worthy addendum to this list. (39)

There is a tendency in Deleuze scholarship, and one sees it sometimes in this volume and in Gardner’s essay, to focus on the Deleuzian concepts that aim at combating any form of “micro fascism”, for example the rhizome or the nomadic, but one must not forget that the nomadic and the rhizomatic, for Deleuze, always work together with and against the arboreal and the royal. My question then becomes: how would these other aspects figure into Gardner’s account of Beckett?

Sarah Posman’s essay, “Where has Gertrud(e) Gone? Gertrude Stein’s Cinematic Journey from Movement-Image to Time-Image” is a well-researched and well-written chapter that shows how Gertrude Stein could be seen as trying to overcome the 19th century conventions of literature in order to move literature into a new form, a form deeply impressed by the invention of film. This essay is the third essay of Part One of this collected volume. The author carefully studies Gertrude Stein’s view of movement, as expressed in her writings, and how it comes to play itself out both in terms of images and time. Posman demonstrates how both cinema and the work of Henri Bergson come to influence Stein’s own writing. She does this by focusing on Deleuze’s Bergsonism, where Deleuze reads Bergson’s Matter and Memory as the undoing of realist and idealist views of matter. According to Deleuze’s reading of Bergson, as reported by Posman, what is central for Bergson is the image and how we shape our worlds and ourselves by the images we select and remember. “Images are quite simply all there is.” (44) I am not sure this is exactly what Bergson had in mind,2 as there is more to Matter and Memory than its first chapter, but we can understand how this Bergsonian shift can help us rethink the way we construct images or receive them; this certainly was the case for Stein. Posman ends her essay by maintaining:

Using Gilles Deleuze’s cinematic Bergsonism I have not only shown how Bergson’s concern for the movement of time speaks much the same language as Stein’s early portraits, that of early cinema thriving on movement-images, I have also argued that in evolving from her cinematic portraits to the landscape of her opera ‘Four Saints’, Stein announces the future of cinema in creating a time-space quite like the Bergsonian time-image. In evolving from movement-image to time-image, then, Stein was indeed doing what, by Gilles Deleuze’s account, the cinema would be doing. (55)

The final essay in Part One, Karen Houle’s “(Giving) Savings Accounts?”, examines the work of Marilynne Robinson, Housekeeping. Houle reads the novel and the protagonist, Sylvie, in a nomadic fashion. More specifically, Sylvie shows us what is at stake in one’s life when the economy of saving and giving are employed. Drawing from figures like Foucault, Levinas and Bataille, the author shows how Sylvie comes to incarnate a form of life and set of relations that falls out of the norm of thinking about these social conventions. Houle observes,

In Housekeeping, the family home, the family, and the entire contents of their lives rotate away from one set of relations (‘proprietary, property, proper’) towards something else entirely, some other form of life, the significance of which the novel, and this chapter, are an effort to gesture towards. (76)

This essay is a clear and straightforward application of Deleuzian-Guattarian categories onto literature. It shows how one can reread literature using a different theoretical framework. Novel in Houle’s analysis is the way she weaves together various thinkers of recent French thought vis-à-vis Deleuze and Guattari.

Part Two of this edited volume consists of seven essays and is the largest section of the book. The first essay in this part is by Elizabeth Grosz and is titled, “Sensation: The Earth, a People, Art.” The goal of Part II is to reflect on the relation between Deleuze and the notions of image and art. Grosz employs the thought of Deleuze to articulate her own thesis concerning the nature of art:

Art comes not from a uniquely human sensibility, not from reason, intelligence, nor from man’s higher accomplishments, but from something excessive, unpredictable, lowly and animal… . Art is a consequence of that force that puts life at risk for the sake of intensification, for what can be magnified in the body’s interaction with the earth. (81)

Grosz provocatively shows how great painting, following Deleuze and Nietzsche, seeks to overcome itself, creating and undoing forms of life and politics. (96) The painting of Cézanne, Bacon and the Papunya and Utopia artists are employed by Grosz to show how the new forms of painting challenge the traditional forms of art and representation.

The next essay in Part Two, Alliez and Bonne’s “Matisse with Dewey with Deleuze” shows how Matisse’s work demonstrates how Deleuze’s notion of “superior empiricism” (104) works. Original in this essay is the use of the work of Dewey, a philosopher not traditionally paired with Deleuze. The authors focus on Matisse’s The Dance. They claim that it was Dewey, like Matisse, who recognized that art must transcend its usual representative form traditionally localized in musea:

Dewey’s book introduces the conception of a physiology of art refusing the museological spiritualization of the fine arts in forms that separate it from common life (‘the common or community of life’, ‘the stream of life’, ‘the actual life-experience’ . . . ). It is a matter of soliciting the ‘originary forces and conditions of experience which we do not regard as aesthetic’ … in order to intensify them. (112)

Nadine Boljkovac’s essay, “Mad Love”, focuses on Chris Marker’s film La Jétée. Various works of Deleuze are invoked to show how the film embodies various Deleuzian concepts, including emotion as pure element, vision, action and traces. In general, what is rich about the second part of this collected volume is the use of different types of art and images, be it film, painting, drawing, music, etc. Felicity Colman’s essay, “Affective Imagery: Screen Militarism”, examines the relationship between technology, aesthetics and forms of community. She draws from the Deleuzian notion of the machine in order to explain what changes in technology have produced, especially qua militarism. She looks at trophy videos of war and maintains,

The parameters of screen-based recording technologies of military cultures have shifted the dimensions of communities, and explore how a confident movement in free communications and information access has breached an irreparable gulf in the historical relations between a community’s economic circuit of people, and their historical subjectivation. (143)

Colman’s essay poignantly reminds one of the deep political and critical project focus of Deleuze’s work, which ultimately aims at counteracting forms of fascism, both at the macro and micro levels. Jondi Keanne’s “Hyperconnectivity Through Deleuze: Indices of Affect” continues to develop themes of political critique that we find in Colman’s essay. Keanne’s essay sets out to clarify what affectivity is for Deleuze, and he understands it as points of intersection or indices where various sensations intensify. This intensification of sensation shows a hyperconnectivity, which has deep ecological ramifications. (172) In many ways, this is a very theoretical essay and probably would best belong in Part III of the book, which is devoted to Deleuze’s philosophy.

The last two essays of Part II look at contemporary art and Deleuze as an artist. Stephen Zepke’s chapter, “Deleuze, Guattari and Contemporary Art” draws from What is Philosophy? and Deleuze’s critiques of contemporary Continental Philosophy (i.e., phenomenology) and analytic philosophy in order to show how the former reduces reality to lived-experience and the latter produces an info-economy of cognitive capitalism. (176) Zepke analyzes whether the Deleuzian claim concerning the sensation at play in contemporary art is robust enough to overcome conceptual and minimalist claims concerning the nature of art. He claims that there is a robust political agenda at play in Deleuze’s conceptions of art, sensation and philosophy, but though the essay makes frequent mention of this political project, its implications qua contemporary art are never fully developed. The final essay in Part II, Julie Kuhlken’s, “Why is Deleuze an Artist-Philosopher?”, captures, I think, the spirit of Deleuze’s desire to rethink philosophy in new terms: to create concepts and challenge stagnant ones. Though Deleuze and Guattari make the distinction between art and philosophy — philosophy playing with concepts - Kuhlken makes the claim that Deleuze must be conceived as philosopher-artist, and that this is possible, especially given his own concepts of the Body without Organs and the work of Artaud. Deleuze not only comments on art and philosophy, but also produces a genuine connective synthesis between the two disciplines.

Part III of the volume is devoted to philosophy. Constantin Boundas, one of the world’s most renowned Deleuze scholars and translators, has written an excellent essay called “Gilles Deleuze and the Problem of Freedom.” Here, Boundas deftly navigates the body of Deleuze’s corpus, especially his more traditional scholarly philosophical works, to argue that though freedom is associated with the virtual in Deleuze, as the work of Claire Colebrook has shown, it must be set within a series of paradoxes that revolve around human counter-actualizing processes that unleash freedom.

It may be true that freedom is a quality of the Deleuzian virtual (as it used to be a quality of Bergson’s memory and the living force of the total past), but it is also because of this a predicate of the human, being manifested in the latter’s counter-actualizing processes by means of which the excess of the virtual over the actual ‘informs’ and releases the creative act. (223)

Boundas examines very carefully Deleuze’s works on Spinoza, Leibniz, Kant and the Stoics in order to prove his claim. Boundas is a very astute reader of Deleuze and a very sensitive one as well. He is the only author in this volume, I think, to appreciate fully how Deleuzian concepts are not simply pure or unmixed. In fact, they always operate in and over against more traditional and consolidating royal regimes. The same tension is necessary if art, image and text are to be creative.

The final essay in this collection is by Hélène Frichot and is titled, “On Finding Oneself Spinozist: Refuge, Beatitude and the Any-Space-Whatever.” This essay examines what it means to practice becoming Spinozist. Frichot looks at various diagrams from Deleuze’s work on Foucault and shows through an analysis of three stages toward beatitude or refuge how these diagrams can be employed in order to understand what it means to become Spinozist. Here, Frichot plays on the relating between image and text and, given this focus, this essay would be best put in Part II of the book and perhaps Kuhlken’s essay on Deleuze as the philosopher-artist would fit better in Part III, which is devoted to philosophy.

All in all, what Holland, Smith and Stivale have given readers is a collection of texts that largely emphasize Deleuze and Guattari’s later works. I think this work makes a positive contribution to Deleuze scholarship and questions related to literature, art, interpretation and aesthetics, all a testament to the breadth and influence of Deleuze’s oeuvre. Holland’s very succinct introduction resists the temptation to make the texts fit a strict and overarching thematic structure, which is faithful, I think, to the spirit of Deleuze and Guattari. As a fan of AntiOedipus, I found that there was little mention of this text, especially the three syntheses. I wonder if the three syntheses could have proved useful for thinking about art, image, text and philosophy. My suspicion is yes, but one cannot expect a book to cover everything. In fact, Holland, Smith and Stivale are to be commended for putting together a collection of essays that will be influential for future Deleuze scholarship that aims at bringing philosophy and the arts into a closer relationship.

1 This collection continues to expand research into the arts already carried out by such books as: Ronald Bogue, Deleuze on Cinema (Deleuze and the Arts), (London: Routledge, 2003) and John Rajchman, The Deleuze Connections, (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 2000). But what marks the volume under review as unique is its global and truly interdisciplinary approach, drawing from artists, scholars of the arts and philosophers.

2 On page 45, Posman claims that though Bergson may have missed out on the revolutionary potential of cinema, Gertrude Stein did not. This claim is exaggerated as Bergson was deeply influenced by the cinema.