Gilles Deleuze's Philosophy of Time: A Critical Introduction and Guide

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James Williams, Gilles Deleuze's Philosophy of Time: A Critical Introduction and Guide, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 205pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748638543.

Reviewed by Daniel W. Smith, Purdue University


James Williams has emerged as one of the most important and accomplished readers of the philosophy of Gilles Deleuze. After writing two early books on Lyotard (1998 and 2000; see also Crome and Williams 2006), Williams published, in rather quick succession, critical introductions to two of Deleuze's most important works, Difference and Repetition (2003) and Logic of Sense (2008). Between these two books, he published Encounters and Influences, which explored, in a series of extended essays, the relation of Deleuze's philosophy to thinkers such as Bachelard, Whitehead, Kant, Levinas, and Antonio Negri, as well as issues raised by analytic philosophers such as David Lewis (on the concepts of the possible and the virtual) and Graham Harman (on the status of problems) (2005a). Williams has also published a study of poststructuralism (2005b) and coedited a collection of papers exploring the relations between the analytic and continental traditions (Reynolds et al. 2010). The result has been an impressive body of work that is marked by not only by Williams' own interpretive acumen in both the continental and analytic traditions, but also by his own original philosophical voice. In his most recent work, Williams tackles one of the most difficult, yet central aspects of Deleuze's thought: his philosophy of time. In a sense, the book is an expansion of the fourth chapter of the book on Difference and Repetition (the chapter on "Repetition"), which dealt with the same material in a much more condensed form.

Even cursory readers of Deleuze will no doubt be familiar with the broad outlines of his approach to the philosophy of time. From antiquity through the seventeenth-century, time had been subordinate to movement: time, as Aristotle said, was the measure or "number" of movement (Physics 219b2). Since the plurality of movements implied a plurality of times, ancient philosophers sought something immobile or invariant outside of movement (or at least a most perfect movement) that could function as a metric by which all other movements could be measured. In the Timaeus, Plato found a measure for the extensive movement of the cosmos in the celestial schema of the stars, with its cardinal points, while Plotinus incorporated the intensive movement of the soul into the movement of the One, with its emanative processes of procession and conversion. In both cases, time was subordinated to eternity as to an "originary time": in Plato's apt formula, time was "the moving image of eternity" (Timaeus, 37d). The discovery of this eternal invariant was the discovery of the true: the form of the true was that which was universal and necessary, in all places and in all times.

Yet both these domains -- the cosmos and the soul -- remained haunted by a descent into fundamental aberrations that threatened this invariant: unpredictable meteorological movements (the "sublunar") or the restless desires of the soul (the Fall). The Galilean revolution revealed that, despite appearances, the celestial sphere was not eternal -- even stars and galaxies come-into-being and pass-away (4). Indeed, one could say that the descent into temporality is what unites the otherwise diverse disciplines of contemporary science. The question of time not only haunts relativity and quantum physics, but also astrophysics, geology, chemistry, molecular biology, and paleontology, each of which has perfected procedures for dating the age of their objects. The Universe and its particles, the Earth and its life, species, humans, microbes -- each has been dated, and their evolution gathered together into a kind of "chronopedia," to borrow a term from Michel Serres (2003, 335), that has replaced the old encyclopedia. The "laws" of nature may provide the necessary and invariant rules of the game, but the moves of the game themselves are contingent, aleatory, constantly bifurcating. To use Stephen Jay Gould's well-known image, if we rewound and replayed the tape, it would produce a different story, a different game, different times. The sciences themselves, in other words, have put ancient Cronos back on the throne.

It was Kant who provided the first full philosophical expression of this mutation in modern thought. The relation of time to movement was inverted, and originary time was replaced by "ordinary time": time ceased to be the measure of movement; rather, it is movement that takes place in time. In Kant, time became the "pure and empty form" (82) of everything that moves and changes -- not an eternal form, but precisely the form of what is not eternal. Time was thereby rendered autonomous and independent, liberated from cosmology and psychology, as well as the eternal. Kant's argument that the Self, the World, and God are all transcendent illusions is derived directly from this new status of time. Before Kant, time had largely been defined by succession, space by coexistence, and eternity by permanence; in Kant, by contrast, succession, simultaneity, and permanence are all shown to be modes or relations of time. The result of this other Copernican revolution would be a fundamental change in the relationship of philosophy to temporality, which would take as its object the new rather than the eternal. The production of the new would be the correlate of ordinary time in the same way that the discovery of the true was the correlate of originary time with the ancients. For Deleuze, as a result, the aim of philosophy would no longer be to discover pre-existent truths outside of time, but to create non-preexisting concepts within time.

Although it is true that modernity, no less than antiquity, has remained preoccupied with creating metrics for space and time (GPS, clocks, time zones, time tables, etc.), such metrics, even if they are grounded in natural rhythms and periodicities, remain conventions, artifices. The nature of time can no longer be confused with its measure. The underlying "metaphysics" of time has profoundly changed, and it is this metaphysics that constitutes the object of Deleuze's philosophy. "Bergson says that science has not found its metaphysics, the metaphysics it needs," Deleuze once wrote, "It is this metaphysics that interests me" (Villani 1999, 130).

The immense accomplishment of Williams' book is to have isolated the fundamental components of the metaphysics of time developed in Deleuze's works, and to have subjected them to a rigorous analysis. His introduction (chapter one) sets the stage by laying out the two basic concepts in Deleuze's theory of time. The first is the concept of a manifold (or multiplicity), which Deleuze derives from Riemann, but to which he ascribes a purely philosophical status (3). In effect, multiplicity replaces the old metaphysical concept of substance. Just as Riemann created a non-Euclidean concept of space as an n-dimensional manifold with no pre-given metric, Deleuze formulates a non-chronological concept of time as an n-dimensional and non-metrical manifold defined by "a formal network of processes" (3) that are "interacting with one another" (9). As the pure form of change, this manifold is characterized by its infinite variability, or chaos: "Chaos is characterized less by the absence of determinations than by the infinite speed with which they take shape and vanish" (Deleuze and Guattari 1996, 42). These evanescent determinations are not the "parts" of time but, more properly speaking, its singularities, and time is less a flow than a combinatory of these singular elements.

The second concept is that of synthesis; the modalities of time, in turn, are the result of the synthesis of these elements: "out of a chaos of unrelated particulars, paths are selected" (30, emphasis in original). Here too, as Williams shows (30), Deleuze appropriates the Kantian concept of synthesis by modifying its status: in Kant, syntheses are activities undertaken by the mind or the subject, whereas in Deleuze, by contrast, they are passive processes that are constitutive of both minds and subjects -- and indeed, of objects as well (32). Summarizing his thesis, Williams writes: "Every determinate thing is a combination of singularities, forming a multiplicity that is changing in multiple ways according to the syntheses of time" (187n10).

The heart of the book, however, lies in its central chapters (two through five), where Williams expands on the concept of synthesis, and presents detailed analysis of the three fundamental types of temporal syntheses proposed by Deleuze: habit (present), memory (past), and the new (future). We can only provide a few hints here of the richness of Williams' analyses of the three syntheses.

First Synthesis (Habit). Kant restricted synthesis to the activity of the subject, since knowledge depends on the synthesis of our sensations or intuitions in concepts or schemata. Yet the possibility of even receiving sensations (receptivity) depends on the passive syntheses of the body, and every organism is itself a synthesis of water, nitrogen, carbon, chlorites, and sulfites, and so on (38). These are not active synthesis that we undertake, but rather passive syntheses that we are, that we can at best "contemplate" (giving this ancient notion a contemporary sense) (27). If Deleuze, following Hume, considers these organic syntheses to be contracted habits, it is because they are all temporal: each contraction constitutes a living present of the body (as well as a mens momentanea), in which the future appears as need and the past as genetic heredity. In this sense, the body is an integral of a plurality of temporal retentions and expectations. Chronobiology, for instance, has shown that our bodies are composed of dozens of biological "clocks" or rhythms -- cardiac, digestive, nervous, molecular -- which are not always commensurable, and which can easily be upset (e.g., by jetlag). Fatigue and exhaustion, in turn, mark the slackening of these temporal syntheses. Moreover, if we speak of mental fatigue as much as metal fatigue (47), it is because what is true of the organic is no less true of the inert, as Williams discusses in a wonderful passage entitled "Of Pebbles and Their Habits": "Each pebble contemplates the sea and the tides, the currents and the storms, the mass of sister pebbles, flotsam and broken shells" (38).

Second Synthesis (Memory). This manifold of synthesized and contracted presents, with their variable rhythms, find their condition, in turn, in what Bergson called the pure past. Although we tend to think that the present "is" and the past "is not" or "is no longer," the opposite is in fact the case. No matter how small it may be, it is the passing instant that "is not" (since whenever we try to grasp it, it has passed on and been replaced by the succeeding instant), whereas the past itself is preserved (it "is" the case that I wrote this review). In his classic text Matter and Memory, Bergson, on the basis of similar reflections, deduced the necessity of the pure past (or pure memory) as the ontological condition of time, without which the present would never pass (55). The contemporary revival of interest in Bergson is due in no small part to Deleuze, and Williams brilliantly highlights two aspects of his appropriation of Bergson. First, the concept of the pure past is the result of a properly transcendental deduction (59ff.).  Second, this deduction does not attempt to establish a foundation (in the usual sense), but is instead grounded in a set of paradoxes (63, 68): the paradox of contemporaneity (the contemporaneity of the past with the present that it was), the paradox of coexistence (the coexistence of all the past in relation with the new present in relation to which it is now past), and the paradox of pre-existence (the pure element of the past pre-exists the passing present) (63). One of the most original aspects of Williams' book is his analysis of the role that paradox plays in Deleuze's philosophy as "the passion of thought," as what can only be thought. "Deleuze has placed a productive and genetic paradox where once there were philosophical foundations" (83; cf. 52-3, 63, 163, 173n1).

Third Synthesis (the New). Williams devotes two chapters (chapters four and five) to the third and most complex synthesis, which concerns the conditions for the production of the new (the future). But is it not paradoxical to search for the conditions of the new, since the conditioned (the new) would be determined by its conditions, and thus would not be truly new, like an effect that is already contained in its cause? The answer is yes, and this is why all the "categories" of Deleuze's ontology (difference, singularities, divergence, multiplicity) are differential categories: they have no self-identity, but are constituted internally by difference. Thus, when they are actualized, they are differentiated, that is, they produce the new. This is also the reason Deleuze proposed replacing the possible-real couple with the virtual-actual relation: whereas the real resembles the possible, and the actual differs from the virtual. Time, for Deleuze, does not move from one actual term to another, but from the virtual to the actual (from the virtual manifold to its actualized syntheses) (73).

Williams is at his best when, particularly in "Time and the Eternal Return" (chapter five), he explains why Deleuze approaches all these syntheses through the rubric of repetition. (In Difference and Repetition, the chapter on time is entitled "Repetition for Itself"). In his book Repetition, Kierkegaard had attempted to make repetition a category of the future rather than the mere recurrence of an x in the past. Hume had already shown that repeated series such as AB, AB, AB . . . themselves produce something new, namely an expectation or habit (when A appears, we now habitually expect B) (3). Similarly, when in 1789 the French revolutionaries were determined to restore the past and live their lives as "resuscitated Romans," this act of repetition produced something new, the French Revolution. The past (as condition) and the present (as agent) are here transformed into dimensions of the future (the creation of the new) (97): repetition as metamorphosis. In his fifth chapter, Williams adroitly shows why these reformulations of the concept of repetition reached their culmination in Nietzsche's doctrine of the eternal return, which Deleuze interprets, not as an endless recurrence of the same, but as the repetition and production of difference (115).

There are, to be sure, many other treasures to be found in Williams' book, including discussions of destiny and freedom (68ff), Proust's importance for a theory of time (77f), and an intriguing section on "The Do's and Don'ts of Time Travel (7ff):

Deleuze's philosophy does not allow for time travel as it is popularly conceived, for instance in science fiction . . . . according to Deleuze's account, we are travelling back and forward in time all the time with no need for special machines or for odd physical properties such as wormholes." (8)

But the core of Williams' analysis lies in his clear explication of a metaphysics of time as non-metrical manifold of coexisting syntheses (140), as well his elucidation of the complex philosophical methodology Deleuze utilizes to construct it (a methodology that combines empirical observations and transcendental deductions within a broad speculative framework [31, 46-7, 68]).

"The point of an interpretation," Williams writes toward the end of his book, "is to explain and perhaps enhance, to connect and differentiate, to exemplify and add voices, to chime with and offer counterpoint, to develop and to unpick, to analyze and give reasons, to criticize and, with luck, to expand" (153). One indeed finds all this, and more, in all of William' works. Though he follows Deleuze's text closely, he goes far beyond it, posing questions and raising issues in his own distinctive voice. And although Deleuze appeals to numerous figures from the history of philosophy, Williams insists that a narrow focus on exegesis risks "blunting originality and falling into stultifying question about fidelity" (12-13). He is generous with his footnotes, which are deliberately intended to give readers access to interpretations different than his own (2).

If there is a less-than-hidden agenda in the book, it appears in the opening pages, where Williams admits that he ultimately tends to read Deleuze as a process philosopher of time in a Whiteheadean mode (2; cf 135). Although Whitehead fades into the background, the term "process" does not, even though Deleuze himself did not thematize the concept. Indeed, the word appears on almost every page of Williams' book, and effectively becomes the key to all the other concepts: a manifold is "a formal network of processes" (3), "syntheses are processes" (113), "the pure past is a process" (77), "pure becoming is a process" (140), and "time itself is process" (3). Deleuze admitted his affinities with Whitehead, but it would be helpful to know the ways in which Williams' rather sweeping use of the concept is intended to provide a link between the two thinkers.

Most of the book focuses on the theory of time presented in Deleuze's 1968 Difference and Repetition, but the final two chapters (chapters six and seven) examine the slightly different theories of time presented in Logic of Sense (1969) and The Time-Image (1985). Williams reconciles his analysis with the first, but -- somewhat surprisingly -- he warns that the second adds little to, and perhaps even takes away from, the earlier elaboration of Deleuze's philosophy of time. Given its appeal to images and to Bergson's philosophy, The Time-Image threatens to collapse the plurality of times back into a unity (161-2) (despite the fact that the seminars Deleuze gave while writing The Time-Image provide a wealth of new material on the philosophy of time; see the "La Voix de Gilles Deleuze" website at the University of Paris 8). Though Williams clearly lays out the reasons for his hesitations (see esp. 192n1), a final question is left lingering at the end of the book: if concepts are no longer eternal but are themselves subject to the manifold of time (philosophy as the creation of concepts), would not the concept of time itself be subject to its own becoming and metamorphoses?

Gilles Deleuze's Philosophy of Time is an impressive achievement, both as an interpretation of Deleuze and as an original contribution to the philosophy of time. Its presentation of time as an irreducible manifold of synthetic processes stands as a needed antidote to textbooks that often tend to reduce the philosophy of time to the oppositions of McTaggert's A-series versus B-series, or tensed versus untensed language, or even presentism versus eternalism.


Crome, Keith, and Williams, James, eds. 2006. The Lyotard Reader and Guide. New York: Columbia.

Deleuze, Gilles and Guattari, Félix. 1996 [Original French ed. 1991] What is Philosophy? Translated by Graham Burchill and Hugh Tomlinson. New York: Columbia University Press.

Deleuze, Gilles. 1990 [Original French ed., 1969]. Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester, with Charles Stivale; edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York Columbia University Press.

Reynolds, Jack; Chase, James; Williams, James; and Mares, Edwin, eds. 2010. Postanalytic and Metacontinental: Crossing Philosophical Divides. London: Continuum.

Serres, Michel, 2003. L'Incandescent. Paris: Le Pommier.

Williams, James. 1998. Lyotard: Towards a Postmodern Philosophy. London: Polity Press.

Williams, James. 2000. Lyotard and the Political. London and New York: Routledge.

Williams, James. 2003. Gilles Deleuze's Difference and Repetition: A Critical Introduction and Guide (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.

Williams, James. 2005a. Encounters and Influences: The Transversal Thought of Gilles Deleuze. Durham: Clinamen Press.

Williams, James. 2005b. Understanding Poststructuralism. Durham: Acumen Publishing.

Williams, James. 2008. Gilles Deleuze's Logic of Sense: A Critical Introduction and Guide. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.

Villani, Arnaud. 1999. La guêpe et l'orchidée: Essai sur Gilles Deleuze. Paris: Éditions Belin.