Global Ethics and Global Common Goods

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Patrick Riordan, Global Ethics and Global Common Goods, Bloomsbury, 2015, 222pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472580863.

Reviewed by Ryan Davis, Brigham Young University


The last decade has witnessed a dramatic expansion in the literature on global justice. A diversity of questions have been asked and given at least candidate answers. Does equality matter across national boundaries, and if so, how? What criteria "trigger" the existence of particular egalitarian norms? When is intervention in another state morally permissible? What rights should persons have to move between sovereign political states? Previously a small sub-field of political philosophy, there is today a wide menu of options responding to each of these questions, among others.

Given the lively debate in global political philosophy, it may be surprising that, as Patrick Riordan notes, philosophers have had relatively little to say about the good in global politics. Instead, prevailing work is largely informed by either a background consequentialism or else a broadly Kantian-Rawlsian contractualism. He aims to fill this gap, offering an entry into the global justice literature from a perspective squarely within the Aristotelian intellectual tradition. Through a wide-ranging philosophical survey extending from action theory to ethics and the English School of international relations theory, Riordan defends the intelligibility of common goods for groups of persons, including the largest possible group -- humanity itself. Although he believes in the importance of common goods (and also defends a concept of the highest good), in his book he stops short of delineating the common goods that ought to be pursued by international political actors. Instead, his project might be roughly characterized as participating in the nascent emergence of a global "we" capable of deliberating about what common goods deserve our collective attention.

Riordan's strategy is to begin with basic concepts and then apply them in incrementally larger contexts. He affirms the existence of attitude-independent goods. Some things are good regardless of our valuing them, and we appropriately value them in response to their goodness. Individual goods are represented as concrete instances of more abstract values (for example, a just verdict at a trial vs. "justice" generally). Following Richard Kraut's 'developmentalism', there is a special interest in the goods of human development and flourishing. Common goods typically involve cooperation, where there is some shared understanding of the aim of a common activity. However, to say that something is a common good is not to say that each member of some group in fact believes it to be a common good. It is only to say, in the way of Bernard Williams's reasons internalism, that there is a "sound deliberative route" from the person's "actual interests" to the good in question (p. 41).

Riordan accepts value pluralism as well as the idea of a highest good. These theses might appear to be in tension as the first affirms incommensurability between values, while the second apparently invokes a neutral ranking of values (at least, a ranking between the highest good and other, subordinate goods). This tension is resolved by viewing the highest good as a choiceworthy arrangement of the plurality of lower goods. Abstractly put, the highest good for a person is to live a life whose narrative is choiceworthy as a whole.

Just as individuals can have a good, so can groups. Riordan uses the example of a university. The flourishing of a university is constituted by the flourishing of the individual persons who comprise it, and similarly it is good for each member to be part of a university that is flourishing as a whole. For him, the concept of "common good" is capacious. Common goods can include concrete goods collectively aimed at, the means to those concrete goals, or systems that make available the means to concrete goods.

Common goods involve cooperation (active participation) or collaboration (acceptance or recognition). Riordan regards institutions as created by the agreement or acceptance of Status Function Declarations, which create a reality that they also represent (think of a piece of paper counting as legal currency, or a uniformed person with a gun counting as a solider) (p. 100). In this, he follows Searle's account of social ontology.

With this as background, Riordan begins an exploration of international relations, primarily through the lens of the English School. On the picture he paints, the international system is not purely anarchic. It is instead organized according to international rules, the legitimacy of which is sufficiently recognized to meaningfully constrain the behavior of powerful states. As such, there is something like collaboration internationally, underwritten by a conception of the good that is -- at least in outline -- shared. The international system is thereby a means to genuine common goods and, as such, itself counts as a common good.

With a footing now firmly established in the international world (including discussions of related concepts from game theory and economics), Riordan turns his attention to international political theory. Beginning with a discussion of Rawls's agenda-setting work, he finds an inclusive conception of a global common good within The Law of Peoples. Many theorists have taken up Rawls's concept of a decent people, whose society is worthy of toleration despite not keeping all of the requirements of justice recognized by liberal democracies. For Rawls and his followers, decent societies deserve toleration in part because their members reasonably identify with socially recognized common goods, so intolerance toward them would count as a failure of respect. Riordan also identifies passages in Rawls that suggest liberal democracies also share a common good -- the provision of justice to each citizen.

One purpose Riordan has is to show how the international theory developed by English School scholars can be made to cohere with the vision of global justice espoused by Rawls and some subsequent philosophers. Riordan surveys the cosmopolitan literature as well as nationalist views about global justice. What is to be learned from this debate, he proposes, is that "the 'we' of political justice is not reproduced on the global level" (p. 175). Sufficient motivation for collective action is only possible through coordination of "global institutions." Nevertheless, he has some optimism about the development of institutions capable of articulating and defending an international common good. In particular, human rights present an area where such a process is already underway.

I hope this brief overview conveys that this book conducts a wide-ranging survey of literature connecting to action, the common good, and international political theory. It helps to show how these different literatures could speak to each other more than they have so far. Some empirical theorists of international relations regularly invoke normative concepts without attention to developments in the philosophical literature. Likewise, debates about global justice regularly carry presuppositions about how the international world actually works. Certainly both sides could learn more from each other, and Riordan helpfully pushes toward greater mutual understanding.

Riordan's book also offers a delicate touch in handling traditional objections to ethical theories centered on the good. Riordan is well aware of the worry that a theory that is grounded in a "highest good" will be insensitive to the recognizably wide variation in conceptions of the good. Won't such a theory tend to privilege some conceptions over others? Riordan's view works to avoid this problem by starting with a concept of an individual's good that prioritizes the "liberty and autonomy" of persons (p. 24). With these values frontloaded, the resulting theory of global human goods can more easily avoid a charge of parochialism.

If anything, Riordan might be accused of excessive restraint in identifying specific common goods. After his elaborate presentation of common goods, collective common goods, highest goods, and global common goods, one might expect a least some speculation about the content of these goods. Riordan resists any gesture in this direction. "To attempt such a list would be to slip into a prescriptive mode, expressing obligations and suggesting what people ought to value," he writes (p. 203). But I am not sure what this resistance amounts to. Riordan is a realist about such goods and does not express any skepticism about their epistemic accessibility. If there are global common goods and we can know them, why not begin a discussion of their content? Does the refusal to adopt the "prescriptive mode" suggest only that doing so would be beyond the purposes of this particular volume, or is there some normative reason against specifying goods more generally? In other words, is the reason against naming particular goods more about the constraints of a single project or more about the virtues of a kind of common goods quietism?

I should add that the reluctance to adopt a critical mode of engagement is clearly not a concluding excuse. It reflects an intellectual commitment displayed throughout the book. Riordan discusses the work of theorists from a variety of disciplines, and throughout maintains focus on what might be learned or constructively borrowed from other work. He is more interested in building on earlier theorists than detailing their errors. Sometimes this emphasis on constructive engagement can risk obscuring serious problems with some foundational writing in the global justice literature. On a few occasions, a work is cited as seemingly authoritative even when it has been subjected to sustained criticism by other philosophers. But there is also a kind of harmony between Riordan's philosophical aims and his style of philosophical conversation. In a book that is foremost concerned with showing there can be a highest common good -- even among diverse peoples living in societies organized very differently -- it perhaps make sense to begin by finding what is both good and common among other philosophical proponents of a more just global order. Striking a tone of collaborate engagement might be one step -- however modest -- in bringing together the "we" that Global Ethics and Global Common Goods desires and anticipates.