Global Inequality Matters

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Darrel Moellendorf, Global Inequality Matters, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 186pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230224575.

Reviewed by Eddy Souffrant, The University of North Carolina at Charlotte


Darrel Moellendorf's timely book is a welcome addition to the literature of Global Ethics. On one hand, it revives the debate that has sought to settle the issues of whether we owe anything to those that fall outside of an artificial or set boundary of nationality, citizenship, culture or race; on the other hand, the book continues the discussion surrounding whether we might identify a system of norms that would prove to be beneficial to the development and sustenance of the global human population. Moellendorf's book tackles both issues with elegance and clarity.

To respond to the first issue of whether and how we may justify benevolence or charity toward others on the global stage, Moellendorf reminds us that, regardless of whether we deal with maladies (acute or chronic) or with basic needs, one guiding principle should remain in our sight: we are to uphold the principle that humans are beings whose dignity ought to be respected. Dignity is to remain a concern, especially in circumstances where persons are in need of basic resources or would benefit from opportunities. Moellendorf argues that some persistent inequalities are especially reflected in the differences of opportunities that await, for example, a child who is, by accident, born in Mali and a child in the USA. When inequalities such as the disadvantages that result from accidental geographical placement are considered, they have generally been thought to be resolved by way of beneficence. The accidents of birth have been thought unfortunate indeed, but such misfortunes do not convince the presumed objective observer that they command compulsory duties of justice to redress them. Conditions of misfortune around the globe are redressed, so the thinking has gone, by way of charity and benevolence, but not out of a sense of duty.

Moellendorf's book establishes that, rather than resting on the goodwill of benefactors, the response to these conditions should be motivated by two crucial factors. The first of these is the recognition of the respect due to each person by virtue of the person's inherent dignity; the second is the duties of justice. Justice is not an obvious guiding principle in global international affairs, but Moellendorf's work offers a compelling analysis that -- even if not convincing -- causes us at least to ponder whether there are other, more effective ways to respond to the problem of global inequality.

Moellendorf operates in two registers at once: the inherent dignity of persons and what we owe to each other. He argues at one level for establishing the morality of actions that would aim to, at worst, restore the dignity of persons or, at best, sustain the respect due to persons. But knowing full well the limits of goodwill and that certain local or global conditions of needs are caused by humans, he provides us with the tools with which to make claims on others and on institutions for our viability as persons. For him, when the dignity of persons is undermined by global conditions, duties of global justice must take hold. He pleads his case in seven steps that also constitute the chapters of the book. In Chapter 1 this trajectory begins by demonstrating that one form of global inequality is income inequality; the need to embrace global egalitarianism and address the issue of global income inequality is the first instance of why global inequality matters.

Moellendorf proposes that a reduction in global income inequality will help eliminate absolute poverty. He relies on human dignity to help him establish the starting point for the duties of justice that will help reach a global egalitarianism. He prefers duties of justice because he believes them to be better able than humanitarian duties (indeed, to be best able) to found a global egalitarianism that eliminates the human-caused inequalities for which he seeks recourse. What is worthy of attention given these conditions is the proper regulation of human affairs.

Moellendorf argues that the duties that follow from a conception of justice in general are also more appropriate than humanitarian ones because justice is the operative system that delineates the "practical normative conceptions" (p. 7) for organizing human affairs. Thus justice, for him, calibrates human affairs and is further reinforced by the recognition that persons are due respect by virtue of their inherent dignity. This dignity and its expectations of respect, Moellendorf argues, would in addition authorize persons to demand that institutions of power be constrained for egalitarian goals. By the end of the chapter we gather that the deployment of justice is intended not only to constrain -- as is often the case -- specific national institutions but also global institutions and activities, in order to achieve the end of a global equality.

The argument is simple but well woven: justice is the operative concept for regulating human affairs. It protects the dignity of persons and reinforces their rights, but, more importantly, it is poised to serve a similar goal at the global level. Moellendorf targets an ideal social setting that he calls the "common good association" (p. 12) (CGA), against which contemporary associations might be measured. The CGA is an association whose members hold no pre-association moral entitlements. Instead, they jointly produce goods and powers that are useful to all. No person comes to the association with already established social privileges. It is thus an egalitarian and moral society that is susceptible to disturbance when harm is caused. Moellendorf uses Chapter 2 to explore the alternative approaches that some contemporary philosophers of global affairs have offered to carve out appropriate responses to the conditions of harm that undermine human dignity and, prospectively, the CGA.

He notices that some versions of the alternatives have been extensions of the distributive justice paradigm. He shows the reader that the ordinary applications of the distributive paradigm always result in an attempt to justify partiality or a policy of redistribution. These applications are admittedly restorative but they are so only with respect to a narrow group. In the main, distributive justice is most liberal towards compatriots of some sort or other. It applies to those who share a common nation or political ideology. For a multinational or ideologically diverse environment, the distributive justice paradigm would be unattractive. Less damaging, but still fueling the detractors, the cost of distributive justice is also high. It entails coercion. The latter attribute of the paradigm, however, is deemed acceptable when its goals are seen as fair. Fairness, nevertheless, is narrowly construed. Distributive fairness is indeed more palatable, so argue its proponents, when it takes place between individuals who share a common bond, a nation-state. The nation-state that is to be impartial with respect to the happiness of individuals would advocate, as an expansive determination of its role, a partiality with respect to the goods and basic resources that are conducive to the happiness sought by each individual.

Coercive policies implemented to purportedly bring about a just distribution or a redistribution of basic goods would be justified only if that redistribution/distribution would take place among compatriots. Moellendorf's Chapter 2 does not do much to disabuse us of the parochial and coercive interpretation of the distributive justice paradigm. Instead, he challenges the paradigm's presumption that only compatriots would have a morally relevant call on our goods and services, in order to show that there are other morally relevant principles at work in the global community that would compel us to recognize a duty to facilitate the access to goods and resources to non-compatriots.

Drawing from the discriminating arguments of Richard Miller, Michael Blake, and Thomas Nagel, who perpetuate the distinction between compatriots and non-compatriots, Moellendorf argues that we find two accounts of justice. On one, it is thought that justice is brought about by coercion in order to redress cases of injustice and conditions of inequity in an environment wherein a culture of privilege was promoted through policies of partiality. On the other account of justice, justice is a requirement to make available to all goods and resources that are necessary for individual autonomy. This imperative of justice is pressing because those who take part in the social condition have no alternative to it. If Moellendorf is correct, this second conception of justice would justify our duties to non-compatriots on the basis of the moral value of their inherent autonomy.

Moellendorf believes that the latter formulation reveals the condition that has exacerbated global inequality. The various instantiations of this inequality find a fitting response in his conception of justice. In the process of formulating this response, he articulates the guiding principle that proves to be the rudder of the remaining sections of the book:

I wish to uphold what I call the principle of associational justice, which is the following: Duties of justice exist between persons who have a moral duty of equal respect to one another if those persons are co-participants in an association of the requisite kind, one that is relatively strong, largely non-voluntary, constitutive of a significant part of the background rules for the various relationships of their public lives, and governed by institutional norms that may be subject to human control. (p. 33)

In Chapter 3, Moellendorf rejects a principle that is more general than the compatriotic/non-compatriotic principle of justice. This time it is not compatriotic and non-compatriotic justice that is at stake but membership and non-membership in general. When it can be determined for a particular political or social environment that participants do or do not share a membership, the demands of justice will be considered. If they do share a membership, the duties of justice apply. If they do not, some other principles apply.

The key question that Chapter 3 seeks to answer is how to identify the types of associations that would promote duties of justice. Moellendorf acknowledges that economic institutions, as well as political associations, generate duties. Economic institutions trigger duties of reciprocity; they do so by virtue of their ability to affect the economic as well as the moral interests of persons. Since economic production relies for its success on the civil and legal structures of the society within which the economic engine is operating, Moellendorf thus believes that the duties of reciprocity would at a minimum require that wealth be likewise distributed. Moellendorf's argument might be attractive because it is supported at the local level; the difficulty, however, is to translate the duties of reciprocity from the local level of states or nations to the global environment. A global economic association does exist; the challenge for consists in delineating its related duties.

Moellendorf meets the challenge squarely in Chapter 4, which attempts to resolve the problem of Chapter 3 as I have articulated it. Here he argues that individuals enjoy certain benefits that are undeserved, such as the benefits that are bestowed on the basis of place of birth. He reassures the reader that he is not advocating an egalitarianism of talent, nor is he questioning the justice of reaping the benefits of such talents. He asserts rather that the privileges enjoyed by some in the global association by virtue of a particular citizenship -- privileges which are by definition exclusionary -- prohibit non-citizens from pursuing goods that are important for respect and the sustenance of dignity. Moellendorf supports global equality of opportunity because he is aware that the privileges conferred by some citizenships are by definition exclusionary and exclusive. Global equality of opportunity would help eliminate the indiscriminate granting of privileges that accidental citizenship confers. In his view, such a fair regime, which would include a liberalization of immigration policies, would be morally desirable and would serve to guide local and global policies with minimum efforts and change.

Chapter 4 also goes a long way to reject partiality to compatriots and sets the tone for Chapters 5 and 6. In these chapters, Moellendorf identifies certain contemporary organizations and conditions that help make the case that there are global associations that meet the basic requirements he sets for the implementation of a global justice. The global economic association that establishes protectionist and bi-lateral policies that in turn establish unfair, even if contractual, practices between capitalists and especially workers in the developing world are rejected. These policies promote conditions for what would be construed as a global economic association that offers no alternative to those who are left out of the benefits of contemporary economic exchanges and conditions. That state of affairs requires the duties of justice that Moellendorf believes are exemplified through associations like the World Trade Organization (WTO) and the General Agreement on Tariffs and Trade (GATT), which purport to promote, if used properly, multi-lateral activities. The WTO and GATT would help spread the benefits of a global market economy.

The solace that Moellendorf finds in just and intentional global associations such as the WTO and GATT is shaken by conditions like climate change. In Chapter 6 he tackles the problematic of climate change and argues that the current poor would suffer more from the after effects of climate change as their numbers increase. Given their prospective vulnerability, Moellendorf suggests that the plight of the poor must be taken equal account of in the effort to reduce CO2. Moellendorf considers a number of potential candidates for a solution to the emissions problem and concludes that a fair reduction regime would be one that sets a standard to be reached in general but also makes room for the concerns of the populations of increasingly developing nations. The significant aspect of this chapter is that it poses a problem that cannot be said to be strictly a problem of the "other" in the manner in which poverty might at first look seem to be.

Placed in this framework the problem of emissions is construed as a truly global problem that will not be solved by adopting humanitarian principles and their incumbent duties as primary motivators. We are all subject to the nefarious consequences of climate change and as such we all have an equal stake in its reduction. This realization supports the possibility of a just regime that would not depend on the formation of a global state but would rather simply depend on the common vulnerability of all. The justice that would mitigate such emissions uses "common vulnerability" to encourage both the inclusion of the poor who would disproportionately be affected by the effects of climate change and the adoption of global institutions to oversee reaching the goal of an overall reduction. The inclusion of the poor in the conversation about a global issue and considering the prospect of a consensus for solving the problem of emissions are two components of a first approach to a global problem. The constituents of that approach as Moellendorf has articulated them hold the promise for a model for developing just global institutions.

In Chapter 7 Moellendorf argues that global inequality can be remedied by justifiable global distributive institutions. He thinks he has established that there is a global economic association and asserts that in its current form it fails to treat persons as equals and, in addition, is unjustified in many other ways. So an appropriate starting point for him is not redistribution, for that approach would mistakenly assume that the current format of distribution is the morally acceptable baseline. Rather, for Moellendorf, we should begin with the recognition that some conditions are unacceptable and a redress is required. Once there is agreement on which conditions are unacceptable, the task is then one of responsibility and of the delegation of such a responsibility. Distributive institutions tasked to redress the inequities of the global scene will harbor two basic components. The one component is to determine that there is an injustice and who will solve it; another is to target the injustice with effective policies.

The clarity of Moellendorf's analysis does not shield it from the uncertainty of the political process. For even if and when the injustice is targeted and the institutions to resolve it are considered and even put in place, there remains the political problem of anchored interests or entrenched positions even in a representative democracy. Obviously the privileged, in any regime, just or unjust, global or local, will be hard-pressed to let go of the advantages of their position. Furthermore, a political battle is even more inevitable in the anarchic world of global affairs than in local affairs. Moellendorf correctly observes that global inequality matters and that the privileges that specific individuals or groups of individuals enjoy within any society (however large) are not accrued in a vacuum. These observations combine to make a call for global justice timely and justified. Moellendorf's is a precision global justice that targets particular areas of inequity (economic, health, educational, environmental) and assigns to all the responsibility to develop the distributive institutions that would identify both the beneficiaries and the vulnerable produced by the conditions of unjust inequalities and work at once to eliminate the inequities they produce.

The elegance of Moellendorf's argument throughout the book makes it difficult to be critical of the work. I am generally sympathetic to his emphasis on responsibility, as I am to his adoption of a principle to promote respect for the dignity of persons. It is also an advantage of his work that he discusses admitted problems of contemporary global affairs: poverty, illiteracy, chronic health problems, CO2 emissions. The last of these examples is, in my view, the clearest instance of a global problem in need of a collective global solution. I do not know -- and this is a criticism more of our times than it is of Moellendorf -- whether there is a more clear-cut example of a global problem than that of pollutant emissions. The task, it seems to me, of any student of global affairs wanting to follow in the footsteps of the work laid out by someone like Moellendorf is to show that there are many more of those clear cases of global problems requiring global collective moral actions. But even if this task is daunting, it is certainly sufficient to acknowledge the tremendous service performed by Moellendorf's book.

If there is room to improve on his work, that improvement will take his contribution as seminal and expand on his initial suggestions to show how we arrive at the conception of a collective responsibility. This theoretical point aside, what he has done is articulate clearly the complexities of determining that some circumstances are indeed instances of global threats that warrant a collective action. He has taken for granted that the object of the collective action is a global concern and that he has explained well why the collective action is a duty. He is forceful in his belief that the actions to redress the global problem are not simply expressions of humanitarian duty susceptible to "aid fatigue," especially if the problem is chronic. The collective actions that Moellendorf advocates are expressions of the duties of justice. In the end, the duties of justice offer an important foundation for moral global actions, even if they provide only one version of these foundations. For that effort, this reader is appreciative of a book that is well argued and that offers a path for adroitly applying philosophical arguments to solve vexing contemporary global problems.