Global Justice and Avant-Garde Political Agency

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Lea Ypi, Global Justice and Avant-Garde Political Agency, Oxford University Press, 2012, 226pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199593873.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University



This book is a terrific contribution to the literature on global justice. In fact, it is one of the most exciting contributions to the field in recent years. Lea Ypi offers a fresh defense of global egalitarianism, embeds that defense in a penetrating discussion of philosophical method and proposes an intriguing account of the connection between political theory and practice. She makes illuminating use of historical material and draws rewarding analogies to debates in the philosophy of science and aesthetics. This book takes political philosophy as the culturally and intellectually interconnected enterprise that it should be.

The debate that Ypi advances is framed by cosmopolitanism and statism. Cosmopolitans commonly think states (and shared membership in states) have little normative significance. As opposed to that, statists commonly think demands drawing on membership in states outweigh most demands of global distributive equality. Ypi's alternative view is "statist cosmopolitanism," according to which both the state and global distributive equality matter. The position that cosmopolitanism does not have to give up on states is familiar for instance from the work of Kok-Chor Tan and Gillian Brock. They think we can accept special concern for compatriots if rather demanding obligations towards the rest of the world are also recognized.

For Ypi, however, the way states matter is that without them global distributive equality would not be politically effective and motivationally sustainable. In our world it is within states that political agency is organized in its most effective form. States also provide the cultural and educational setting where individuals acquire their attitudes. Individuals are motivated to see themselves enduringly as citizens of the world only if civic education instills that frame of mind.

So without harnessing the power of states, cosmopolitanism remains idle talk. At the level of principle, however, we should accept an ideal of global equality. It lies in the nature of Ypi's outlook that the details of that ideal will only transpire in due course through an exchange between activists and theorists in response to problems around us. But that ideal at the very least requires that power differentials among states be substantially diminished.

Claims about principle tell us what we should do. Claims about agency tell us how to do it. Cosmopolitans tend to focus on principles but neglect agency. Statists often derive principles from reasoning Ypi thinks is best interpreted as concerned with agency. By way of contrast, Ypi proposes a "dialectical" method that combines principles and agency. Enlisting that method, she defends a version of cosmopolitanism that accounts both for the normative desirability of the cosmopolitan ideal and for the political feasibility and motivational sustainability of the agency required to pursue it. If only cosmopolitans thought thoroughly about how to bring about their principles, they would become statists at the level of agency and stop belittling shared membership in states as morally arbitrary. And if only statists reflected on their theorizing, they would realize that the good things they say about shared membership in states do not ultimately deliver principles. They would also realize that a commitment to eradicating absolute deprivation (which they normally do have) entails a version of global egalitarianism at the level of principle.

Ypi is interested in activist political theory, theory that seeks to change the world rather than to interpret it differently. Activist theory gradually shifts public culture in a way that advances progressive projects. The main audience for activist theory is the political avant-garde, that particular group of politically conscious and engaged people who suffer from the injustices of an era and who at the same time have taken it upon themselves to bring about change. Activist theory and avant-garde activism belong together. The avant-garde is the "ratio essendi" of activist theory, and activist theory is the "ratio cognoscendi" of the avant-garde (p. 66). Without the spearheads of political change, with their demands for change and their articulation of basic concerns, there would be no activist theory to affect political reality. Without activist theory we could not identify the avant-garde.


Let me discuss Ypi's ideas in more detail, focusing on several pivotal chapters. I read Ypi's approach through the lenses of my book On Global Justice (Princeton, 2012). There is some intellectual convergence between Ypi's reasoning and mine, but there are also substantial disagreements that I seek to articulate.

The dialectic method is introduced in chapter 2 by way of contrast with both purely ideal and purely non-ideal theorizing. The nature of and relationship between these two kinds of theorizing has come up for much scrutiny in recent years. The dialectic method seeks to go beyond that debate by assigning an appropriate place to elements from both kinds of theory. Ideal theory asks what justice requires as a matter of principle regardless of whether the proposed principles can meaningfully guide political action. Only in a second stage does such theory ask how we should go about realizing such principles. As opposed to that, non-ideal theory explores how theory should enable us to guide political action here and now. It does so by exploring how our current political practices are most commonly interpreted.

Once we focus on theories that aim to change the world, says Ypi, we can see how both principles of justice (and thus elements of ideal theory) and an account of agency (the main topic of non-ideal theory) become integral elements of political theory. The initial account of this method is very general: "in its simplest and more accessible formulation we can think of it as the method of learning from trial, failure, and success" (p. 40). Ypi explains this choice of definition in a footnote: she wishes to offer a definition that even Karl Popper (staunch critic of the usual defenders of dialectic, Hegel and Marx) could accept. But we need to know just how we should learn from trial, failure and success, and how this would integrate components of ideal and non-ideal theory.

Ypi explains that the method applies when societies face conflicts within their sociopolitical practices. Theorists and activists will then reflect and articulate specific interpretations of the underlying concerns and propose resolutions. The proposed ideas must be revised and redone. Eventually theories emerge that can provide guidance to action. New institutions are not just created from nothing, but retain some of the old patterns and practices while profoundly modifying them so they can respond to the conflicts that triggered the original soul-searching. Eventually the same process starts anew within the new institutions.

The core of the dialectic method is a set of criteria that select the right theory under such circumstances. First of all, that theory must offer a successful diagnosis. What kind of conflict is at stake? Why do people resist existing structures? In the conflict between cosmopolitans and statists, Ypi thinks cosmopolitanism offers a better account than statism of why many people feel excluded from the success of globalization and why they have justified grievances. Secondly, a successful theory must be innovative: it must formulate normative principles that preserve what has been plausible all along while improving on the status quo in ways that resolve the conflict. In the example of statism vs. cosmopolitanism, cosmopolitanism has the better of the debate because it preserves statist commitments to moral obligations to those outside of the state (which statists capture in terms of sufficientarian duties) without implausibly limiting egalitarian commitments to those who share a state (as statists do). Finally, there is a theory's heuristic potential: does the theory offer guidance for dealing with conflicts that appear under the new interpretation? In the case of statism vs. cosmopolitanism presumably the debate has been resolved in favor of versions of the latter by the first two criteria. The third helps with the selection of one version of cosmopolitanism over others.

Ideal theory enters because principles of justice are appealed to for guidance. Non-ideal theory enters by rendering these commitments determinate and relevant within existing social and political practices. But what mistake would a philosopher make if she said, "I'm just dealing with ideal theory," or "I'm just dealing with non-ideal theory"?

Somebody who limits philosophizing to ideal theory loses opportunities of grounding her theories in practice. Analogously to the scientist who continues to postulate the existence of different planets to hang on to Newtonian physics, the ideal theorist might be tempted to introduce more and more assumptions when testing intuitions in the search for principles. Theories formed under simplifying and embellishing circumstances of thought experiments mostly reflect a theorist's skill at doing the mental acrobatics needed to manage them. But they might offer no advice when we need it. And that by itself would reveal that it is an error to think ideal theory can be done in insolation to begin with.

What mistake do those who focus on non-ideal theory make? In this case, practices and existing expressions of political agency play a pivotal role in identifying normative principles. But then the question becomes how we know that our assumptions informing our interpretation of social practices are not simply biased in favor of the status quo. To be sure, Ypi's dialectical method seems closer in spirit to non-ideal theory than to ideal theory because it takes existing practices as a starting point. Unsurprisingly she refers to the dialectical method as a "refinement" of non-ideal theory (p. 56).

However, it remains unclear why precisely she thinks her approach succeeds in overcoming the faults she finds with other non-ideal-theory approaches. Most specifically, it never really becomes clear why her three criteria would not be subject to a status quo bias. Sections 5-7 in chapter 2, where the topic is discussed, are unfortunately hard to follow and do not possess the same clarity that we find in the rest of the book. They set out a large program to explain how political theory and practice are connected, but do so at an abstract level that makes it hard to assess how precisely the different formulations Ypi uses to characterize the dialectical method relate to each other. While she uses the occasional historical example, what we need to make this method come alive are some in-depth case studies.


While I will return later to the point I raised at the end of the preceding section, let me flag a number of additional issues here. First of all, one wonders about the choice of name for her preferred method: why call it "dialectic"? Ypi tells us that "dialectic" is a much abused term (p. 40), which suggests there is a correct way of understanding it, and presumably implies that what she gives us approximates that understanding. The starting point she chooses to appease Marx, Hegel and Popper all at once leaves the method at an unsatisfactory level of generality. But it becomes clear as we go along that Ypi's method is rather closely related to the Hegelian and Marxist manners of using dialectic. Hers is an ambitious program about political change and the role of ideas in it that seems clearly inspired by Marx and Hegel while doing without Hegelian metaphysics and without Marxist historical materialism. But then why not be more straightforward about this rather than introduce the method at a level of excessive generality only to appease one of the fiercest critics of those who actually seem to provide the inspiration?

A second issue is this: even though the method is introduced as a refinement of non-ideal theory, what I think is the typical sort of non-ideal theory problem for philosophers is not even on the radar. That mundane kind of problem is how to apply political philosophy to one problem at a time. Suppose I am committed to a vision of a just society that imposes only minimal constraints on immigration. Presumably this aspect of a just society could not be implemented in isolation. If the country in question is the U.S., one would need to think about what changes Americans have to make in their behavior to make sure a U.S. with open borders does not bring ecological doom to the planet. And presumably such a border policy would make sense only as part of a globally unified immigration policy. So what advice is there to give to a politician who is wondering about what stance to take on immigration as a matter of fairness to everybody but who also does not want to be laughed out of court in the next election? I do not know how Ypi's theory could address such questions. The individual activist or theory-sensitive politician seems to get little advice here. The focus is on the political avant-garde as a group.

Let me raise a third point. As I mentioned, Ypi rejects a particular view of the connection between ideal and non-ideal theory. The connection is that we put ideal theory in place first and then work through problems of non-ideal theory, keeping in mind what ideal theory prescribes. But perhaps that view of "ideal theory first and non-ideal theory second" is defensible after all. My point turns on one striking bit of intellectual convergence between Ypi's book and my On Global Justice. Chapter 16 of my book reflects on the limitations of utopian reasoning. Ideal theory must be limited by what we can theorize with reasonable completeness. Political theory might stipulate all sorts of things about what society would be like. But what we need to know is how to get from such stipulations to a reasonably complete understanding of domestic society or world order, as the case may be. Only a theory that is reasonably complete in this way and thus tells us what a world created in its image would actually be like can be action-guiding.

This realistic-utopian understanding of ideal theory would be action-guiding and thus not subject to Ypi's objections. The kind of non-ideal theory inquiry that is properly matched with ideal theory then is the kind I mentioned under the second point. So this way of combining ideal and non-ideal theory also has the advantage that it would bring the most common kind of non-ideal theory problem on the radar of political theory. Finally, this way of combining ideal and non-ideal theory would avoid the demanding theoretical commitments of Ypi's view. On that subject I have more to say when we discuss chapter 7. Suffice it to emphasize for now that there is indeed a noticeable bit of intellectual convergence between Ypi's approach and mine in the way in which both approaches object to ideal-theory building that cannot be action-guiding. But while I use these objections to refine the aforementioned view on the connection between theory and practice, Ypi uses them to give up on it.


Chapter 3 engages the debate between statists and cosmopolitans directly. In different ways, according to Ypi, they both get confused about the distinction between ideal and non-ideal theory, in a way that the dialectical method can rectify.

Ypi argues that statists often shift from the question of what kind of relations and practices ground valid distributive claims (and thus ultimately generate principles of justice) to the question of what kind of relations must be in place for such an ideal to be considered politically and motivationally viable. In other words, at a crucial point in their argument, statists tend to shift from a matter of principle to a matter of agency. After all, it is a matter of principle to explore the relations necessary for articulating certain demands on the distribution of the good generated in a collective venture of sorts (such as states). But we are addressing matters of agency once we start reflecting on how agents should interact with each other, including questions about whether the relations that allegedly generate distributive claims should hold in the first place. According to Ypi, statists make a mistake by focusing on the relevance of states as a matter of ideal construction. But the best philosophical case for states is to view them as particular associate relations capable of transformative political agency.

Cosmopolitans, too, make a mistake when it comes to assessing the state. They dismiss membership in states as morally arbitrary, and therefore find no value in the fact that individuals are born and socialized into communities.

When it comes to reflecting on agency, Ypi argues, cosmopolitans ultimately have no choice but to locate transformative agency in the individuals themselves. Thinking of individuals along such lines, however, for Ypi is not merely simplistic and uncompromising, but deeply misguided philosophically. After all, both political theory and political agency evolve from organized reactions against injustice, and interact with each other in the process. Ypi urges cosmopolitans to take seriously that the state is the natural home for the kind of collectivities that give rise to both aspects of our political lives. The sense of justice itself only evolves in communities.

In a nutshell, the standard mistake of cosmopolitan theory is that it is committed to idealizing individual moral agency. The standard mistake of statist theory is that is must idealize associative political membership to such an extent that it overlooks important circumstances of injustice. The challenge is to explore how to reflect on circumstances of injustice in a way that neither idealizes individual agency nor limits normatively relevant relations to shared political membership.


Ypi grants much more normative significance to the state than cosmopolitans normally do. Nonetheless I submit that Ypi, too, falls short of giving the moral significance of the state enough credit. Membership in a state matters both from a standpoint of agency and from a standpoint of principle.

In On Global Justice I distinguish among several grounds of justice, features of populations that generate principles of justice. Shared membership in states is such a ground because it is a kind of cooperative and coercive relationship where as a matter of principle people have the kind of stringent claims characteristic of distributive justice. This is not the time to spell out the details, but there is an objection to Ypi lurking here. The objection is that once we ask why the state can fulfill transformative functions, we are led to properties of the population that share membership in the state. But it is in virtue of those very features that those people are also in the scope of particular principles of justice. Crucially, it is the same aspects of the state that generate particular principles of justice that, at the same time, make the state significant from a standpoint of agency, as Ypi argues.


Chapter 5 makes the case for cosmopolitan principles. Cosmopolitans and statists worry about absolute deprivation, starvation and malnutrition. Statists think of this problem in sufficientarian terms: we should make sure everybody has enough. But this approach, Ypi insists, does not think deeply enough about causes. We have so much deprivation globally because some countries are so much more powerful than others. The only way of reliably and enduringly eradicating absolute deprivation, therefore, is to eradicate at least extreme versions of relative deprivation, that is, extreme power differentials.

In the case of one class of goods -- positional goods -- absolute and relative deprivation are causally related. Positional goods are those whose absolute value is determined by their relative possession. For instance, the best litigator in town may win all her cases. So the relative standing of one person among the lawyers determines the outcome of many lawsuits. Or suppose a group falls into a persistent majority and a persistent minority, but constitutionally the group is required to decide everything by majority vote. The persistent majority (a relative designation) would win every single vote.

So where positional goods are involved, absolute deprivation may be caused by relative deprivation, for instance, if people are condemned to starvation through lack of employment, educational opportunities or market power. Ypi here refers to the work of Amartya Sen on famines (p. 116). What causes starvation is not an absolute shortage of food or social exclusion, but the fact that economically some groups are left behind while others advance. Relative inequalities cause starvation, say, because the purchasing power of the successful raises prices for basic food or because less food is produced as producers cater towards the luxurious tastes of the wealthy. In global politics where decision making is based on states competing and bargaining with each other, a reduction of inequalities in the distribution of power is necessary to improve the absolute position of weaker states and thus to eradicate absolute deprivation. The trade regime is a case in point.

Ypi insists that philosophically sensible statists should accept global egalitarianism at the level of principle and redefine their statism at the level of agency. Limiting equality to the domestic level while endorsing sufficientarianism globally untenably fails to theorize relative deprivation as a matter of injustice.


I think this argument for global egalitarianism fails. Sure enough, there are many situations where the logic of positional goods requires that everybody have the same for each to have enough. Consider a group of fighters who are equally good at their business. Suppose their technology has produced one superior and one inferior weapon. One fighter possesses the superior weapon whereas everybody else uses the inferior one. If they meet in pairs, the fighter with the superior weapon will always win. The fact that he has the better weapon means the others will be destroyed. Under suitable assumptions (e.g., they always meet in pairs, fatigue plays no role, etc.), the only way of ending this supremacy is to make sure all fighters use the same kind of weapon.

But global politics is nothing like this. An equal distribution of power is not required to make sure all have enough. There are other ways of assuring they do. In fact, the work of Sen that Ypi quotes is commonly understood (and understood by Sen himself) as pushing for a particular take on human rights rather than for global egalitarianism. Sen's thesis on famines is that they occur only in political structures where the government does not need to be responsive to the interests of all, especially not those of the downtrodden. The remedy in the first instance is to give everybody civil and political rights to make sure they are heard and can take political action if pushed aside. The main opponent is somebody who thinks social and economic well-being can or should be advanced without civil and political rights being protected. The reverse consideration would hold as well: civil and political rights are not enough to make sure everybody can lead a decent life. Basic protection of material interest as captured by social and economic rights must also be in place.

In other words, robust human rights protection is required to make sure those with more power cannot push that power beyond a certain limit that is put into place to make sure everybody has enough. As long as in world politics other measures are available that protect everybody's ability to have enough, considerations drawing on the positional nature of power do not push us towards global egalitarianism.

Ypi is right that there is something problematic about a statist view that limits global commitments to material sufficiency without theorizing the context of injustice at the global level. One kind of injustice is that many people are left without subsistence and security. Another kind is that the global trade regime is shamelessly skewed in favor of the wealthy. Another is that countries possess disproportionate access to the world's resources and spaces and do not allow for these inequalities to be remedied via immigration policies. But all these ways of articulating injustice at the global level fall short of calling for global egalitarianism as a remedy. Nor do they keep either theorists or activists from articulating a strong egalitarian commitment for the domestic context while endorsing other principles to address global injustice. This is my own take in my theory of multiple grounds of justice in On Global Justice.

A response may be that robust human rights protection and improvements along other lines can only be guaranteed if power differentials themselves are kept in check. Otherwise any improvements would be by the grace of the powerful and thus could be withdrawn. But for one thing, "the powerful" are not a unified group, and with the rise of China in this century that is becoming ever clearer. Moreover, Hobbes's point that in the state of nature all are relevantly equal may not readily apply to states, but nonetheless, even those who are strong on the military side need partners for many other tasks. Global politics is full of conflict, but, especially because of trade, international relations offer a plethora of mutual benefits. Global politics is not a zero-sum game.

A different reply to that response is that Ypi's argument in a way goes too far. If we take literally the idea that the most powerful state in the world is like the fighter who can defeat ever other fighter in separate combat, and that world politics is somehow like a sequence of one-on-one encounters of that sort, we must take reforms far beyond what Ypi may be comfortable with. What would it mean, for instance, for the US and Nicaragua, for China and Cambodia, or for the UK and Uganda to be equally powerful, if only "in proportion?" There is no good way of spelling this out that would stay in touch with political reality, the way the dialectical method requires.

I have not engaged with the underlying causal claim that the global power differential has a major causal responsibility for the persistence of poverty. On this subject I will only say that any such causal claim would require a defense against a range of other causal claims about global poverty that have been advanced in recent times. Ypi's argument in terms of positional goods could not provide this by itself.


Finally, let me discuss chapter 7, on the cosmopolitan avant-garde. Ypi tells us that the historical relevance of avant-garde political movements "has consisted in their ability to elaborate concrete projects for the emancipation of society by occupying the empty space between the critique of existing institutional practices and normative interpretations in need of being contextually recognized" (p. 162). The designation "avant-garde" can only be conferred at a stage when the theorist is no longer a mere spectator and assumes a politically active role (which of course ipso facto reflects helpfully on how Ypi sees herself).

Ypi's discussion makes contact with the work of constructivists in international relations. Constructivism contrasts with both international relations realism and international relations liberalism. The former explains world politics in terms of the self-interest of states. The latter does this in terms of how countries project their own value commitments into the international sphere. In contrast to realists, constructivists believe ideas have a deep-reaching explanatory role in world politics. In contrast to liberals, they believe the ideas that play this kind of role are not restricted to the value commitments of countries that are being projected out into international relations.

Constructivists have done much work recently on the history of the human rights movement and explained how issue-specific movements that could be considered precursors to the human rights movement have brought about substantial changes in world politics. Examples include the women's movement, anti-slavery movement, and workers' movement. In all those cases political avant-gardes played a major role in bringing about change. It is in line with these movements that Ypi identifies (and thereby as a theorist also endorses) the contemporary cosmopolitan avant-garde as the many ordinary citizens, as well as the countless social movements, that form part of what has often been called the sphere of global civil society. Left-wing parties are also in this mix. The World Social Forum is a natural home for the many organizations that compose the avant-garde.


Let me make some critical remarks on Ypi's understanding of the avant-garde. A first point draws on my doubts about her argument in support of global egalitarianism. Global egalitarianism for Ypi is the philosopher's contribution to the diagnostic and innovative tasks the avant-garde faces at this stage. But in addition to my doubts about the internal success of her argument, we should notice that the avant-garde as Ypi defines it -- both the historical movements she mentioned and the contemporary cosmopolitans -- has not been primarily concerned with global-egalitarian ideals. Some parts of it have been, but others have concerns that are not readily assimilated into an egalitarian paradigm, for example,concerns about fairness in trade, migration, human rights and climate change. I submit that pluralist internationalism, the view I develop in On Global Justice, which recognizes several grounds of justice, is a more plausible candidate to provide a philosophical theory for Ypi's avant-garde, partly because it develops the idea that world politics is the site for much injustice while having little use for global-egalitarian ideals.

But more importantly, let us reflect on the important connection Ypi makes to the work of contructivists such as Kathryn Sikkink, Martha Finnemore, Thomas Risse and Margaret Keck. Constructivists bear a twofold burden of proof within their discipline. They must fend off competing explanatory approaches championed by realists and liberals. At the same time they must establish the fruitfulness of their approach against more quantitatively oriented scholars. They do so by doing conceptually and empirically rigorous research. It is worth looking briefly at what they do because this can tell us much about the kind of work Ypi would need to do to illuminate her dialectical method.

In 1998, Sikkink and Finnemore published an article entitled "International Norm Dynamics and Political Change" in International Organization. This article has been cited several thousand times. Its success is due to the careful manner in which the authors develop the notion of a "norm cascade." A norm cascade occurs when states and international institutions embrace an emerging norm. "Norm entrepreneurs" -- individuals with organizational platforms who use information and expertise, formulate organizational priorities and engage in public advocacy to promote particular norms -- and their supporters persuade the relevant rule-makers of the norm's appropriateness and effectiveness to their respective organizations' mission and even legitimacy. In a next stage, "norm internalization" may occur. This is the case when a norm begins to take on a "taken-for-granted quality" and gets incorporated into organizational routines.

Sikkink herself has applied this notion of a norm cascade in her 2011 book The Justice Cascade: How Human Rights Prosecutions are Changing World Politics. The book pulls together the experience of human rights prosecutions in the last two decades over several continents, identifies commonalities and differences, and turns a great deal of apparently loosely connected material into a coherent narrative. The book traces the origins of the emerging norm that former state leaders should be subject to prosecution for acts committed on their authority when in office. Sikkink offers evidence that trials are not correlated with adverse results, such as more repression, as many had feared. However, she also grants that her conclusion about the effectiveness of trials should be viewed as tentative pending further analysis.

Ypi suggests that hers is intended to be a general theory about the exchange between theory and practice in politics throughout history. This is a much more ambitious claim than what Sikkink makers, one that involves far-reaching claims about the way in which ideas have mattered in politics and have thus contributed to change. Realists, for instance, would account for that kind of change differently. Among historians too the notion of a political avant-garde that, in combination with activist theorists, brings about change would be controversial. Some historians would argue that this perspective makes too little of the importance of large-scale social change.

The rather abstract language in chapter 2, which introduces her method, and the brief discussion of actual scenarios and actors in chapter 7 would need to be supplemented with a lot of empirical work, both in the field of international relations and in the field of history. One way of thinking about this is that if one deploys the dialectical method without Hegel's metaphysics and without Marx's historical materialism, one must provide the substance of the theory in some other suitable way. So potentially Ypi's book has the makings of a great research manifesto. But by the same token, so far it is mostly a manifesto in search of the work needed to follow through. It would be an understatement to say the jury is still out on the success of this program. Under the best of circumstances it will be a long time before that jury could even be convened.


I have disagreed with a fair amount in this book, and for that reason it bears repeating how highly I think of it. The book weaves together difficult ideas in a (for the most part) clear way. It draws connections that are often unexpected, but just for that reason is highly illuminating. Every chapter is well-organized and presents a highly intelligent train of thought. This book deserves to be widely read and studied, and will richly repay any efforts invested in it.