Global Justice and Territory

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Cara Nine, Global Justice and Territory, Oxford University Press, 2012, 232pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199580217.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


1. The territorial nature of states is one of their defining features. Over the last half a millennium or so, people have less and less acquired political obligations through personal relations and vows and more and more through the fact that their birth occurred within a certain territory. In his Elements of Politics, Sidgwick could write that "in modern political thought, the connection between a political society and its territory is so close that the two notions almost blend" ((2005), p 201). It is surprising that territoriality only recently became the subject of sustained debate among political philosophers. It is to this debate that Cara Nine's book contributes.

Three major views have emerged. According to the Lockean view (as developed for instance by Simmons (2001)), the rights of individuals to property pre-date states. The state rules over territory because individuals who subsequently subjected themselves to it had acquired property that subsequently became part of its territory. According to the Kantian view (as developed for instance by Stilz (2009) and (2011)), there are no natural property rights pre-dating the state. Individuals are morally obligated to found states because only subjection to a public will makes sure individuals are not subject to another's arbitrary will. The state's right to rule rests on its ability to provide justice in its territory. The state must, and only the state can, provide secure property rights. Finally, according to the nationalist view (as developed for instance by Miller (1995), (2012)), peoples predate states and have a right to self-determination. Peoples found states to protect their continued existence. The state may rule over the territory occupied by the people because their continued existence requires a location, and their culture is interwoven with the geographical peculiarities of their location.

So according to Lockeans, the right to rule originates from individuals. The rationale for states is that individuals find it in their best interest to subject themselves to states to protect their rights. According to Kantians, that right originally belongs to the state. The rationale for states is to provide a space where individuals can be genuinely free, and they become so through the administration of justice. According to the nationalist view, that right originates from the people. The rationale for states is to protect living arrangements we naturally and sensibly adopt.

While these three offer prominent reference points, there are other views too in this debate. Especially noteworthy are Meisels (2005) and Kolers (2009). Nine adds an important view that enriches the debate substantially. Like the nationalists, she thinks territorial rights are held by collectives. Like the Kantians, she makes the exercise of justice central. And she does all that while developing a collectivist version of the Lockean theory of appropriation. Unlike the nationalists, she does not think territorial rights can be held only by nations. Unlike the Kantians she does not think the presence of states is essential for territorial rights to apply in the first place. And she deviates from the more prominent version of the Lockean approach presented by John Simmons not only in proposing a collectivist approach but also by arguing that the individualist version fails.

Territorial rights, as Nine understands them, include several components: (a) jurisdictional rights over persons within the territory; (b) jurisdictional rights over resources within the territory; (c) ownership rights over resources within that territory; (d) the authority to determine residence, immigration, and citizenship status regarding the region. (a) and (b) concern the authority to set rules and thus the power to make, adjudicate and enforce law. (c) concerns ownership and thus the way objects are used (accessed, maintained, managed, sold, etc.). Jurisdictional rights facilitate the implementation of a conception of justice, whereas ownership rights facilitate the implementation of a conception of the good. Territorial rights are higher-order rights to alter what property rights there are and how they are exercised. But territorial rights and property rights may overlap if, for instance, the state holds the territorial rights also owns certain areas on its territory.

Definitions matter in this debate. David Miller, Anna Stilz and John Simmons all use their own definitions. Simmons, for instance, defines property rights in a way that presupposes that individuals hold property over which the state has no control except that it may tax and regulate its use. So he defines property rights in a way that implies that they exist prior to states, a point denied by Kantians. Nine seeks to offer a definition that stays neutral with regard to the disagreements among the participants in this debate. She thinks (a) and (b) are essential for territorial rights, whereas (c) and (d) are only contingent. A state, for instance, may not own the resources within its territory (if those are subject to international regime of resource use) and may have surrendered the right to regulate immigration to a supranational authority. Nonetheless, that state could still hold the right to rule over the territory in the sense that it makes rules covering people and resources.

But why not say that as long as a state maintains control over access it does not lose its right to territory even if it partially subjects its jurisdictional powers to international regimes? Intuitively, there is no reason to think the right to limit access is less essential to the right to territory than jurisdictional rights over people and resources. Put differently, if we are inquiring about what it means to hold a right to rule over territory, we are ex ante just as much interested in control of access as we are in the legitimacy of the rules over persons and resources within that territory. Nine shows that (c) and (d) are independent of (a) and (b), not that (a) and (b) are necessary and (c) and (d) contingent. Her effort to provide a neutral definition would have been better served without this distinction between necessary and contingent incidents. This is no trivial point since her discussion neglects the subject of immigration. That neglect is justifiable only if one thinks (implausibly, to my mind) that matters of immigration (i.e., of access to territory) are incidental to territorial rights. I return to this point below.

2. There are three components to Nine's proposal. First, there is a general, natural-law based account of territorial rights that establishes criteria for collectives with claims to territory. Second, there is an account of how qualifying collectives obtain rights to a specific territory. And finally, there is a discussion of how her approach fits into the literature on global justice. Let me discuss these themes in turn. A general right to territory, as she puts it, is a claim to be self-determining over some territory, leaving open which territory that would be. Territorial rights are justified because they are essential for the provision of individual needs. Individual needs can be satisfied, and individual capabilities realized, only if there is a substantial amount of coordination among people who share a territory with regard to the resources provided by the territory.

For Nine the rights-holders are collectives. Individuals could not be the holders because the nature of the right is jurisdictional and thus presupposes the existence of some sort of collective. States could not be the holders because the demise of a state would otherwise imply the expiration of its territorial rights (or their bequest to a different state), rather than their transfer to an underlying collective. But the holders also should not be restricted to ascriptive groups (e.g., nations) because other groups too may meet the moral purposes for whose sake the rights are held. Nonetheless, Nine's starting point is individual needs. The connection to collectives is made because our ability to meet our needs depends on complicated social institutions. Achieving even minimal human agency requires that a person can obtain threshold levels of freedom and well-being. A share in the control over one's environment is both intrinsically and instrumentally valuable. (By the way, this reasoning also shows why claims to deep underground resources or Arctic regions are implausible.) All this amounts to a natural-law based approach because Nine refers back to generic features of persons and derives prescriptions from them.

But not just any collective qualifies, and thus not just any collective will be able to obtain specific rights to a particular territory. A qualifying collective must (a) demonstrate the capacity to meet minimal standards of justice (that is, that it has the capacity to meet individual needs in a minimally just way); and (b) have members who share a common conception of justice. If other entities exercise authority over territory, then fundamental rights of individuals are violated. Territorial jurisdictional authority is important for the coordination of geographically dependent common goods (e.g., potable water, sewers, public education, health care, public order). It serves basic individual interests that there is a public authority that adjudicates these matters.

But why does a society have to be just to have the right to territory? If the purpose of territorial rights is to enable the kind of coordination that is necessary for individuals to satisfy basic needs, why would it not be enough to maintain order? Coordination does not have to be justly arranged to enable individuals to satisfy their needs. For Nine, even a Rawlsian decent society would have no right to territory. Nine's reasoning seems to be this. To solve the coordination problem that must be solved for individuals to be able to meet their needs, the collective must have coercive measures at its disposal. Such measures are acceptable to individuals only if they are deployed as part of a just system. A less than just society would wrong (at least certain) individuals in particular if it coerced them to comply with its jurisdictional rules over persons and resources.

Nine's standards are demanding. To be sure, she talks about a demonstrated capacity to meet minimal standards of justice. After all, she argues against the Kantians that states are the wrong rights-holders because a collective would not lose its territorial rights if it found itself in the grip of a failed state. But then one wonders whether a collective would lose its rights if it currently fell short of implementing justice in its territory. The reference to a demonstrated capacity provides relief by allowing for a negative answer to that question. But still, there must be a demonstrated capacity to implement justice, not merely to maintain decent standards. These standards seem too demanding as threshold conditions for a state to have a right to make rules over persons and resources. A decent but not fully just society should not lack the moral authority to make rules within its territory that people should comply with. The impression that Nine's standards are too demanding is confirmed by her second condition, which requires of the relevant collectives that they have members who share a conception of justice. Again one would think decent societies consisting of various groups that do not share a conception of justice would not therefore fail to have a right to territory.

To be sure, this is not a major objection since Nine could adopt somewhat more relaxed standards for groups to have a general right to rule. And while her insistence on justice as the standard is quite demanding, Nine is more flexible when it comes to the ways in which groups would take up territory. Different groups may occupy overlapping territories, and people may belong to different groups with different identities. Self-determination of groups does not have to take on the particular shape of a group having exclusive rule over a particular territory.

3. The second component of Nine's theory is an account of particular territorial rights, an account of how collectives that satisfy the general criteria can establish a connection to a particular territory. Nine's Lockean commitments now come to the fore. There are two ways of spelling out the stance on territorial rights in the Lockean tradition. One is individualistic, the other collectivist. According to the former (which is much better known), individuals contract together to form a state with territorial jurisdiction over their individual properties. The state indirectly acquires territorial rights through the consent of its members. Property rights exist prior to any jurisdictional rights the state may have. This is the Lockean approach I introduced earlier and attributed to John Simmons. According to the latter version of the Lockean approach, a collective can directly gain territorial rights through collective labor on land. It is that kind of approach that Nine pursues. She advances a collectivist Lockean understanding of rights to particular territories by adopting Lockean ideas of desert, efficiency and autonomy.

Nine argues that the individualistic understanding is flawed. The problem turns on the right to secede. Do individuals have the right to secede, according to the individualistic Lockean account? If they do, then we must give up on territorial rights altogether. After all, if any person within a territory can elect to remove herself from the rules, then that collective does not really have the right to rule to begin with. But if individuals do not have the right secede, then the individualistic account does not explain territorial rights. For in that case, the right to territory is not maintained by a contract, at least not one that involves contemporaries as parties. After all, people are not really engaged in a contract if they have no alternative to remaining in the state.

One way or another, this is a long-standing issue for individualistic Lockean accounts. Simmons (2001) addresses it as the problem of internal dissenters. He asks whether a state can build a contiguous territory. Simmons argues that dissenters in the state's interior may withhold allegiance from a state that arose from contracting among other owners. But it would not be prudent because dissenters will be surrounded by owners who have contracted to collaborate in ways that exclude dissenters. If the dissenter wants nothing to do with the contracting parties, the best would be to exchange her lands for lands at the periphery.

Simmons can deploy this line of reasoning to resolve Nine's dilemma. He could happily embrace the first horn: people can elect to leave. They "can," in the sense that they are morally permitted to do so; Simmons also thinks that just about all existing states are guilty of a high degree of illegitimacy because they do not implement the prescriptions of Lockean theory. But although embracing that horn would indeed undermine territorial rights as Nine understands them, it would not undermine territorial right as Simmons understands them. Again, definitions matter. Nine gives us an intriguing new way of worrying about something that nonetheless is an old problem, namely, how to think about people who live within or next to the territory of a state but want nothing to do with that state. Simmons does not face an insurmountable dilemma here.

But let us look at Nine's collectivist version. Generally, agents can acquire land if they change it and thereby create a relationship with the land. That relationship must be morally valuable, that is, as Nine says, it must be established through the fundamental liberal concern for the basic needs of individuals as expressed in terms of principles of desert, efficiency and autonomy. Recall that Nine's primary concern is not with first-order ownership rights but with higher-order jurisdictional rights. The relevant values must be understood accordingly. The master value is justice. It is for the pursuit of justice -- for the establishment of just communities -- that territorial rights can be legitimately claimed. So the different values that guide claims to particular territories must also be understood in terms of justice. As far as desert is concerned, the point is that if the collective interacts with the land in such a way that they are building a just political system, and if in that sense the value of the territory is "significantly attributable" to the collective, then this collective has a weak claim to the land. The claim is "weak" because it may have to be squared with similar claims by other collectives.

So Nine does not simply insist that the collective in question adds material and symbolic value to the land and is in turn shaped by its ways of dealing with the land. While land-use patterns are important, what matters is that these land-use patterns are geared towards the establishment of just communities. To illustrate, in Tolkien's Lord of the Rings, the evil Orcs build a sophisticated underground system of dungeons and mines in preparation for future misdeeds. When the Ents (tree-like beings that keep the forest) flood and thereby destroy these structures during the Battle of Isengard, they are disrupting established land-use patterns. But since the Orcs did not build this system to advance justice, no loss of moral value occurs.

What we have discussed so far concerns Nine's take on jurisdictional rights that are constitutive of the right to territory as she develops it in chapter 4. In chapter 6 she offers a separate discussion of resource rights. Resource rights are rights to actual resources that involve both jurisdictional rights and property rights. Nine introduces what she calls the "theory of political legitimacy over resources." But even though resource rights are formally distinct from territorial rights, and even though she discusses competing theories that apply to resource rights that have not appeared earlier in her discussion of territorial rights, she offers an account of resource rights that is pretty much the same as her account of territorial rights.

Again we are told that a qualifying collective may claim resource rights if it uses its control over those resources to establish justice in the relevant region. Again efficiency and desert enter as criteria, but this time we also get an acknowledgement that they might pull in different directions. Desert is backward-looking, whereas efficiency is forward-looking (p. 140). This conflict is, unfortunately, mostly announced but not further discussed. At this stage an application to territorial conflicts would be apt, and would help round off Nine's theory. Meisels (2005) and Kolers (2009), for instance, offer extensive discussions of the Israeli-Palestinian case, which gives their ideas a concreteness that Nine does not offer. But more importantly, at least this reader never quite gets the point of discussing specific rights to territory in one chapter and resource rights in another if the major point about resource rights too is that they are warranted to the extent that the resources in question contribute to a just community.

4. The second component of Nine's theory, in any event its positive part, follows readily from the first. The first component made sure that collectives have territorial rights if they use the territory in question for building just communities. The second component adds that particular qualifying collectives have claims to particular regions if they use those regions for the pursuit of justice, and do so with a fair amount of success. More controversial issues are on the horizon, however, once we approach the third part of her discussion.

The purpose of that part is to situate her approach within the global justice debate. Her main point is that various arguments that have been made by cosmopolitans do not undermine her position that collectives have valid claims to territory. The thrust of her argument is straightforward in light of how she has developed territorial rights: cosmopolitans should accept territorial rights because those are essential for meeting the needs of individuals. Nine pursues that debate through various arguments that I will not discuss in detail. But this is also an appropriate moment to return to her neglect of the subject of immigration.

In chapter 5 (section 5.4), Nine considers various ways of creating more just access to resources across human beings. The three solutions to this problem she considers are (a) forcefully relocating persons; (b) transferring some control over resources to people outside of the territory; and (c) redrawing boundaries. The first two solutions she finds untenable, and even the third she considers highly problematic. "If the drawing of boundaries pays heed to boundaries of political units," Nine writes, "then this amounts to legitimate political units having a prima facie claim to jurisdictional authority over the territory and resources within their borders" (pp 110-111). She qualifies this claim, recognizing that political units may overlap or have disputed borders. But nonetheless, she gives much play to the thought that a collective that has built a just community has strong claims to the territory within which they have done so.

But in addition to forcibly moving people, putting resources under the control of external authorities and redrawing borders, there is another way of improving fairness in access to resources: immigration. In my own work the idea of creating fair access to natural resources and spaces of the Earth has been prominent, especially in the context of immigration (see e.g., Risse (2008) and (2012), chapter 8). My starting point for that inquiry is the thought that humanity collectively owns the Earth. Once one has spelled out precisely what this could mean one can apply that idea to immigration. Groups are justified in excluding others from the space they occupy only if sufficiently many people populate that space. "Sufficiently many" describes when the number of people occupying that space is proportionate to the value for human purposes of the spaces and resources thereby excluded from general use. If the average person in a given state has access to more resources than people on average do across states, then more immigration should be permitted.

What matters for present purposes is only that immigration is a natural topic to discuss in the context of reflecting on rights to territory. One place where the subject straightforwardly emerges is when Nine discusses how to improve the fairness in the distribution of people over resources around the world. Immigration policies can redistribute people without force. They would not require the surrender of control over resources to an external authority. And they would not require any redrawing of boundaries. Immigration policies, even if geared towards engineering long-term change, could be gradually implemented so as not to undermine the accomplishments of the state in question. One does not need to endorse the view that humanity collectively owns the Earth to integrate immigration into one's discussion about that kind of fairness. It is a peculiar omission that Nine would not discuss immigration although she discusses these other ways of improving fairness in access to resources and finds them wanting.

5. The concern in chapter 5 is to assess what to do about the perceived arbitrariness in the distribution of people over resources. In chapter 7 Nine seeks to rebut the concern that the scope of distributive justice undermine territorial rights. To my mind the most interesting part of that discussion is her engagement with the idea that humanity collectively owns the Earth. For cosmopolitanism to undermine Nine's view of territorial rights, she submits, it must be understood as a theory of territory rather a theory of jurisdictional rights over people. But the only way of doing that is for cosmopolitanism to offer a theory of world ownership.

Following Pufendorf, world ownership could assume two shapes. The Earth could be held in "negative communion" or in "positive communion." The latter is a view that holds that the world population in some way forms a corporate persona with ownership rights. The former holds that each person is at liberty to use all objects on this planet. Positive communion requires a view about how to restrain individual use in light of the fact that humanity as a whole is a corporate owner. Negative communion does not. Cosmopolitans could not possibly endorse negative communion since this would impose no obligations on individuals vis-à-vis each other. But positive communion is also implausible. For it may happen that individuals cannot satisfy their needs because others have a say over the resources. For that reason, Nine says, natural lawyers too have rejected positive communion in favor of negative communion. But that means cosmopolitanism has no way of adopting a theory of world ownership.

However, Nine does not pay sufficient attention to the available range of views on what collective ownership of the Earth might amount to. Cosmopolitans could help themselves to an Equal Division view as proposed by Hillel Steiner; or to a view that holds that the Earth is originally unowned, but property appropriation is subject to a proviso (as proposed for instance by Robert Nozick or Michael Otsuka); or to a view that holds the Earth is originally held in Common Ownership (as proposed by myself). On that latter view, collective ownership includes a liberty right to use, but also an elementary claim right. (For an assessment of these views and the argument for Common Ownership, see Risse (2012), chapter 6, or Blake and Risse (2009) and Risse (2009b) for earlier presentations.) One could be a cosmopolitan of sorts and endorse any of these views about collective ownership. None of them is excluded by Nine's reasoning.

This concern connects back, once more, to my worry about the neglect of immigration. The general gist of Nine's view is that just communities can take up space on Earth and make rules over people and resources within their territory that advance their project of building a just community. Nine is careful to make room for competing claims over the same territory. But what is not part of her standpoint is that territorial rights must be put into a global context. Groups of people make claims to particular regions of the Earth, but the Earth as a whole must be shared among all of humanity. A right to territory cannot plausibly be based exclusively on anything earlier or current inhabitants have done, any more than it can be based exclusively on their collective identity.

Presumably our theorizing about territory has been "local" partly because humanity's manner of encountering the Earth has been. But in light of the fact that humanity increasingly confronts problems that concern its manner of dealing with this planet, a genuinely global standpoint is appropriate. Such a standpoint would support territorial rights only to the extent that they can be justified to those who are thereby excluded from certain regions of the world. Such a standpoint is not forthcoming on Nine's approach. Her neglect of immigration is symptomatic of this problem, as is the short treatment given to ideas of collective ownership of the Earth. Let me be clear, though, in fairness to Nine, that this is a complaint I also have about the three major views about the right to territory I introduced at the beginning. All of them treat the right to territory in a local way, "one state at a time." Immigration can then at best enter as an afterthought. A genuinely global standpoint thinks of territorial rights for each state in relation to what happens elsewhere. Immigration becomes an integral part of a theory of territorial rights.

6. In the concluding chapter 8, Nine discusses what her theory entails for "ecological refugee states," states whose entire territory is predicted to be lost to rising sea levels (such as Tuvalu and Kiribati). The collective whose territory is disappearing may have a claim to a new territory. She makes that argument by appealing to a kind of Lockean proviso. The original version of that proviso in Locke's Second Treatise concerns his theory of property and draws on humanity's collective ownership of the Earth. Individuals can privatize what is originally collectively owned if they leave "enough as good" for others and do not waste anything. Nine formulates a proviso for her theory of territorial rights (which, again, are primarily jurisdictional rights), and does so without making use of the idea of collective ownership of the Earth. Her proviso states that "When the exercise of a particular exclusive right over goods severely threatens the value(s) that are used to justify the right (or system of rights of which it is part), then the particular right should be changed so that it no longer undermines those values" (p 165). She justifies this proviso by an appeal to a general (natural-law based) duty to preserve humanity.

States with viable territories have an obligation to allow the refugee state reasonable access to their territory. Existing territorial rights have to change because changing circumstances put into jeopardy the continued existence of some qualifying collectives. This is not a matter that can be resolved through immigration of individuals -- after all, a qualifying collective does have a claim to some territory, and if the existing territory vanishes, that claim still stands. But now Nine finds herself in a curious situation. On the one hand, disappearing island (and low-lying coastal) states do have a right to collective relocation if they include a qualifying collective. That is the kind of situation the proviso is designed for. Qualifying collectives must be allowed to continue to be self-determining. That in turn means the collective needs an appropriately sized territory, and they need a territory in which they can continue with their established cultural practices. The people of Tuvalu, for instance, should not just be given a territory the size of Central Park, not should they be sent to rural Siberia.

But on the other hand, existing states that include qualifying collectives have a say over what should be done in a particular case. These other states generally have their own rights over territory. So there might be competition for territory. Nine's solution is a system of "nested self-determination" (p 180). In other words, the collective whose land is vanishing underneath them have to be squeezed in somewhere, possibly without receiving territory that is all their own.

As Nine records, I have made a proposal for how to think about disappearing island nations that is much in line with hers (Risse (2009b)). One major difference is that I do not insist that all individuals that belong to a self-determining collective must be allowed to go to the same location. This may or may not work out, depending on whether a suitable receiving state would be under-using its territory to such an extent that taking in the whole population could be expected. Or possibly a country would volunteer to do so and thereby discharge part of its overall obligations of global justice.

I arrive at my solution to this problem by using humanity's collective ownership of the Earth as a starting point and by then applying considerations of proportionate use to the problem of disappearing island nations. One advantage of this approach is that it allows us to see this problem in the context of the general question of proportionate distribution of people over a shared planet. As opposed to that, Nine pays no heed at all to that issue (and thus pays no heed to matters of immigration), no matter what the circumstances are, except when there is a collective whose territory actually disappears. To my mind, a complete neglect of matters of immigration and such a strong concern for disappearing island nations do not sit well together.

I have articulated a number of objections to Nine's account. However, I would like to conclude by emphasizing that she has given us a highly creative book that makes a significant contribution to the debate about territorial rights. It is a book very much worth engaging with.


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Risse, Mathias. 2009b. "Common Ownership of the Earth as a Non-Parochial Standpoint: A Contingent Derivation of Human Rights," European Journal of Philosophy 17 (2): pp 277-304

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