Global Political Theory

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David Held and Pietro Maffettone (eds.), Global Political Theory, Polity, 2016, 332pp., $28.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745687155l.

Reviewed by Emma Saunders-Hastings, University of Chicago


David Held and Pietro Maffettone collect essays exploring the global dimensions -- and arguing for the necessarily global character -- of contemporary political theorizing. The contributors are leading scholars in global political theory, and the book provides an unusually broad view of the field, In addition to the familiar topics of human rights and global distributive justice, it includes contributions on the legitimacy of international law and transnational political institutions; on just war theory; and on a cluster of issues including territoriality, the global economy, and humans' relations to the natural environment and to future generations.

This integrated approach is welcome, and the book as a whole is a valuable resource for readers seeking to acquaint themselves with the state of the art in global political theory. The editors' introduction makes two agenda-setting points. First, they claim, political theory has reached a "cosmopolitan plateau," where acceptance of the equal moral status of all individuals (regardless of birthplace or location) defines the boundaries of reasonable disagreement in normative theorizing. Of course, different authors draw significantly different conclusions from the assumption of equal moral status; many theorists accept it without understanding themselves to be thereby committed to radically revisionist conclusions about global distributive justice or about the entitlements of states to control their own borders.

Second, and more significant, they claim that to date the energy and attention devoted to questions of global distributive justice have not been matched in other areas of inquiry. This collection aims to rectify that imbalance. While it includes a strong pair of chapters on global distributive justice, it devotes more than equal attention to global political justice, to the legitimacy of global institutions, and to other concrete problems ranging from war to international capital flows to climate change. Even more importantly, the editors call attention to the potential for "cross-fertilization" or productive interchange between areas of inquiry in global political theory (and between global political theory and other areas of political philosophy).

The volume advertises itself as an introduction to global political theory, but there is some unevenness in the level of the contributions (on which more below). Not all chapters would be suitable for undergraduate or introductory courses. However, the volume would be a good fit for upper-level or graduate courses, and many chapters are of independent interest. In what follows, I discuss the contributions in the order in which they appear in the volume.

Human rights occupy the most secure position on the cosmopolitan plateau. But despite a relatively well-defined consensus that global justice requires (at a minimum) the acknowledgement and protection of fundamental human rights, both theorists and legal documents conceptualize and defend those rights in different ways. In "The Point and Ground of Human Rights," Rainer Forst offers a justification that draws on Kantian constructivism and on critical theory. He argues that received understandings of human rights too often characterize them as instruments for the protection of passive victims, or as candidate justifications for international military intervention. He argues instead for a reflexive and fundamentally democratic conception of human rights, rooted in the demand for justification and in a conception of persons as both the authors and addressees of laws. This conception originates not from the 1948 United Nations Declaration of Human Rights but from the 1789 French D├ęclaration des droits de l'homme et du citoyen. Forst argues persuasively for an active conception of human rights as "emancipatory weapons" against unjust regimes and social orders.

The next two chapters, by Michael Blake and Darrell Moellendorf, function as a pair, defending contrasting interpretations of the requirements of global distributive justice. Blake defends a statist conception (while also querying the utility of framing the debate in the familiar "statism vs. cosmopolitanism" terms). Moellendorf supports a membership-based cosmopolitan account grounded on the requirement that social orders be justifiable to their members. (It is worth noting that cosmopolitan consequentialism is not represented in this volume.) Blake defends the compatibility of moral consequentialism with statism about distributive justice, since the view that states are (at least at this point in history) unique in the kinds of duties they generate among co-nationals is compatible with commitment to the moral equality of all persons. Moellendorf dissents by rejecting the minor premise: while the territorial state is one kind of association that generates duties of justice between members, the global economic order is another. These chapters give a clear and accessible framing of a core debate in global justice. Helpfully, for readers new to the topic, they also stress the relevance of empirical political science to our judgments about global justice: a satisfactory understanding of our domestic and international duties of justice must rest on an accurate picture of what the world is like.

The ambitious scope of this collection becomes clearer in the next three chapters, all of which deal with issues of global political justice and of legitimacy as a political value distinct from substantive justice. All three are valuable contributions, though written at different levels of generality. Terry MacDonald's "Global Political Justice" will be most helpful for readers seeking an introduction to the topic of global political justice and its relationship to global distributive justice. In a chapter on "The Legitimacy of International Law," David Lefkowitz offers a framework for thinking about the conditions of legitimacy for international law and argues that the current international legal order falls far short of the appropriate standards. For Lefkowitz, this legitimacy deficit represents a serious normative problem, and rectifying that problem might even take precedence over attempts to make the international legal order more just. However, he also cautions against inferring too quickly from the fact that a law is illegitimate that we have no moral reasons to comply with it; this marks something of a difference with Held and Maffettone's "Legitimacy and Global Governance," where the editors seem to want more to follow from a finding of institutional illegitimacy. Their chapter also assumes somewhat more awareness of ongoing debates (with, for example, extended replies to particular interlocutors). Nevertheless, taken together, these chapters on political justice and legitimacy are illuminating, and the successful integration of distributive and political concerns is a real achievement.

The last eight chapters widen the scope further and cover a number of specific issues, beginning with war. As the editors note in their introduction, there has been surprisingly little overlap between just war theory and other research on global justice. Two chapters make the case for opening a dialogue between these fields, and both are standouts. In "Just War and Global Justice," Laura Valentini shows the underappreciated relevance of questions of global distributive justice for questions of jus ad bellum. In particular, the question of whether a war's cause is just may depend on whether the entitlements that the war uses lethal force to defend are themselves rightfully enforceable. Her argument is both novel and accessible, and it provides a vivid illustration of the benefits of the cross-disciplinary approach that the editors advocate.

Seth Lazar's "The Associativist Account of Killing in War" likewise applies a framework more often encountered in global justice debates to considerations of justice in war. He suggests that moral theories of killing in war can accommodate some reasons of partiality. A concern for protecting those with whom we share valuable relationships (and to whom we owe "associative duties" by reason of those relationships) can, under some circumstances, justify "eliminatively" killing people who are not liable to be killed. Eliminative killing may be foreseen and intentional but, crucially, the killer "derives no benefit from the victim's death that he would not have enjoyed in the victim's absence." This is not a comprehensive theory of killing in war; the associativist account cannot (and does not aim to) justify all the kinds of killing that predictably occur in war. But in its context in this volume, Lazar's chapter -- like Valentini's -- highlights the promise of an integrated approach to thinking about individual duties of justice across contexts of war, peace, and poverty.

"Territorial Rights," by David Miller and Margaret Moore, and "Natural Resources," by Leif Wenar provide illuminating overviews of the main ethical and political issues at stake in their respective areas. Either would be suitable as an introduction to its topic. The next two chapters, on trade and capital mobility, tilt in the opposite direction. Aaron James's "Fairness in Trade" is interesting in its own right, but potentially daunting as an introduction to its stated topic: at times, it reads more like an essay in metaethics than an essay on trade. For readers new to the topic, it would have been helpful to include more focused discussions of the specific questions (if any) that trade raises. Conversely, in Peter Dietsch's "The Ethical Aspects of International Financial Integration," the ethical issues occasionally get buried under exposition of the workings of the international financial system. While much of this exposition is probably unavoidable, the chapter would have benefitted from more exploration of the key points of agency and decision-making, and of the competing normative claims at stake.

"Political Theory for the Anthropocene," by Dale W. Jamieson and Marcello Di Paola, is the chapter that feels most out of place in this volume. It operates on a different conceptual terrain than the rest of the contributions, and unfortunately it never becomes clear what we gain from thinking in terms of the Anthropocene. Not enough is said to isolate areas of continuity with previous eras from factors of change; at times, the chapter conveys the misleading impression that collective action problems, and the political relevance of actions that intuitively seem "private," are new features of the post-Industrial Revolution or post-1950s world. Without a more disaggregated picture of the continuities and changes between our current era and previous ones, the insistence on historical periodization risks frustrating the kind of productive interchange across literatures that the editors were seeking to foster. Instead of being able to exchange ideas about a commonly understood set of substantive changes, we risk talking past each other, in different languages.

The final chapter, on "Generations and Global Justice," by Axel Gosseries and Danielle Zwarthoed, does a better job of making the editors' case for productive interchange between different research agendas. Gosseries and Zwarthoed consider diverse problems of distributive justice, historical injustice, and international migration through an approach that integrates questions of global and intergenerational injustice. Moreover, they show that these two areas of inquiry unavoidably overlap, at least to the extent that individuals are the unit of moral concern. (For example, they argue that rectificatory duties are in some sense parasitic on holding a prior view of distributive justice, such that we cannot argue about reparations for past injustices while remaining agnostic on questions of global distributive justice). Like the two war chapters, this contribution on intergenerational justice meets the editors' brief in a way that balances depth and accessibility.

On the whole, this is a valuable collection that highlights the diversity and importance of global political theory. The editors deserve commendation for two achievements in particular. First, they have assembled contributions that convey the breadth of topics covered in global political theory. Second, and more impressively still, the collection illuminates the connections between areas of inquiry within global political theory (and, indeed, between global political theory and empirical political science). Both features will be welcome to readers seeking to acquaint themselves with the field and to orient themselves within it.