Globalization and Global Justice: Shrinking Distance, Expanding Obligations

Placeholder book cover

Nicole Hassoun, Globalization and Global Justice: Shrinking Distance, Expanding Obligations, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 235pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107010307.

Reviewed by Javier Hidalgo, University of Richmond


Many people believe that we have moral duties to reduce global poverty. But philosophers disagree about the nature of these duties and the considerations that justify them. In her book Globalization and Global Justice, Nicole Hassoun aims to develop a new approach to justifying obligations to reduce global poverty. The distinctive aspect of Hassoun's account is that she appeals to the requirements of political legitimacy in order to ground duties to help the global poor. In this respect, Hassoun's account differs from other prominent approaches to global poverty that appeal to duties of beneficence, duties to refrain from harming people, and duties of global distributive justice. The book has two parts. In the first (chapters 1-3), Hassoun argues for the conclusion that legitimate international institutions must ensure that people subject to these institutions can secure basic goods like food, water, shelter, healthcare, and so on. In the second part (chapters 4-6), Hassoun evaluates concrete policy proposals for reducing global poverty.

In chapter 1 surveys the debate between philosophers who believe that people have positive rights to basic necessities and skeptics who argue that people only have negative rights to non-interference. Following Hassoun, let's call these skeptics libertarians. While Hassoun is sympathetic to the view that people have positive rights to basic goods, she claims that defenders of positive rights have yet to give libertarians conclusive reasons to believe that we have significant positive duties to the global poor. So, Hassoun sets out to develop an argument for duties to the global poor that can persuade libertarians. In particular, she aims to show that "a negative right against coercion actually entails positive rights to things like basic food, water, shelter, and so forth" (p. 18).

In chapters 2 and 3, Hassoun defends her central argument. Her formulation of this argument goes:

  1. Coercive institutions must be legitimate.
  2. For a coercive institution to be legitimate it must ensure that its subjects secure sufficient autonomy to autonomously consent to, or dissent from, its rules.
  3. Everyone, to secure this autonomy, must secure some food and water, and most require shelter, education, health care, social support, and emotional goods.
  4. There are many coercive international institutions.

So, these institutions must ensure that their subjects secure food, water, and whatever else they need for sufficient autonomy.Hassoun calls this the autonomy argument (p. 45).[1] Before I comment on this argument, let's clarify what "legitimate" means in premises (1) and (2). According to Hassoun, an institution is legitimate if it is morally permissible for this institution to use coercion to enforce commands and rules (p. 47). Legitimacy is different from justice. While an institution may be legitimate in the sense that it has permission to coerce, this institution might fall short of maximal justice. Legitimacy is also different from justified authority. People may lack duties to comply with the demands of a legitimate institution. So, legitimacy is a minimal moral standard. It is only a liberty-right to coerce.

Premise (1) of the autonomy argument seems trivial. It is merely the claim that coercive institutions should be morally permissible. Let's bracket premise (2) for a moment. Premise (3) is plausible. Hassoun argues that, to enjoy "sufficient autonomy," people need to have access to food, water, and other basic goods. People are unable to exercise their capacities to reason and plan if they lack these basic necessities (pp. 32-33). Premise (4) is plausible too. As Hassoun points out, some international institutions, like the United Nation's peacekeeping forces, clearly issue credible threats of coercion. Other international institutions like the World Trade Organization and the International Monetary Fund in effect impose rules on people without their consent, even if states agree to these rules (pp. 68-87). Hassoun ably defends these premises of the autonomy argument in chapter 1 and 2.

Premise (2) is more problematic. Remember that Hassoun sets out to show that the commitments of libertarians entail significant duties to assist the global poor, despite their rejection of positive rights. But why should a libertarian endorse the claim that legitimate institutions must ensure that subjects secure sufficient autonomy? A libertarian can simply respond that legitimate institutions must only respect people's negative rights to non-interference. That is, a libertarian can just deny that legitimate institutions need to provide people with the prerequisites of autonomy in order to achieve legitimacy. While this libertarian position strikes me as seriously implausible, this position nonetheless seems coherent. Hassoun's discussion leaves it unclear why libertarians' commitments entail a commitment to positive rights.

To illustrate the problem with Hassoun's argument, let's consider the following case. Suppose that Bradley lives alone in the wilderness. Bradley is mentally competent and has the capacity to reason and plan. But Bradley is also starving. He lacks enough food to survive. Another person, Susan, encounters Bradley in the wilderness. Susan happens to have a gun. Without provocation, Susan orders Bradley to fetch water for her, build her a house, and perform other services for her. Susan tells Bradley that, if he fails to comply with her orders, she will shoot him in the leg. Susan's threat is credible. Bradley complies with her demands.

What does Susan owe Bradley? Libertarians claim that Susan has a negative duty to refrain from coercively interfering with Bradley unless he consents to this treatment. But a negative duty fails to imply that Susan has a duty to ensure that Bradley has sufficient autonomy. This negative duty is only a duty to refrain from interfering with Bradley without his consent. Susan doesn't need to provide Bradley with food, water, and shelter in order to satisfy this duty. Susan just needs to leave him alone. Of course, Susan might also have an independent positive duty to aid Bradley. But we are unable to derive this positive duty from Susan's negative duty.[2] Furthermore, the justification of this positive duty has nothing to do with the permissibility of coercion. If Susan has a positive duty to help Bradley, it is surely the case that she has this duty regardless of whether she coerces Bradley or not.

So, it appears false that negative duties entail positive duties. Why does Hassoun think otherwise? I'm not sure, but here is a hypothesis. I think there is an unacknowledged appeal to compensatory justice in the background of Hassoun's discussion. While it may be false that negative duties imply positive duties, sometimes the violation of negative duties trigger duties to compensate the person who is wronged.

For example, it is plausible that, in my fictional example, Susan owes Bradley compensation for unjustifiably coercing him. Susan should not have coerced Bradley in the first place, but Susan now owes Bradley compensation for her past wrongdoing. Similarly, maybe global institutions unjustifiably coerce people without their consent. If so, then these people are owed compensation for this injustice. This strikes me as a more effective argument against libertarians than Hassoun's autonomy argument.[3] But Hassoun never develops an argument along these lines. As a result, her major arguments in chapters 2 and 3 seem incomplete. So, there is reason to doubt whether Hassoun has in fact developed a viable new approach to justifying duties to address global poverty.

In the second part of the book, Hassoun delves into complex empirical debates about how to reduce global poverty. This part is largely independent of the arguments in chapters 1-3. Chapters 4-6 address the following question: if we do have duties to reduce global poverty, how should we go about doing this?

In chapter 4, Hassoun surveys empirical evidence on the effectiveness of foreign aid in reducing severe poverty. In particular, she considers macro-level studies on the impact of aid as well as micro-level studies. Hassoun sensibly concludes that foreign aid can sometimes effectively reduce severe poverty. But, as she acknowledges, this is not really the major question in policy debates about foreign aid. The debate is about when and how often foreign aid can reduce poverty. To address this issue, she considers evidence from micro-level studies, such as experimental and quasi-experimental studies, and finds that the micro-level studies indicate that aid often has good effects. While this is a reasonable conclusion, some caution is in order. Small-scale studies are rarely able to detect the overall impact of aid. Rather, these studies suggest that aid has positive effects on certain measured variables, such as educational attainment. Yet critics of foreign aid often argue that the aggregate effects of aid are negative because aid has corrupting effects on the political institutions of recipient countries.[4] Hassoun neglects to consider this counterargument.

In chapter 5, Hassoun evaluates the claim that free trade reduces poverty. She first argues against the claim that free trade necessarily reduces poverty (although I doubt any reasonable person would actually defend this claim). She then considers the empirical evidence and finds that it is mixed. Hassoun concludes the chapter by arguing in favor of various policies that would make trade friendlier to the poor, such as compensation, fair trade goods, and even restrictions on trade in certain cases. While I do not necessarily disagree with Hassoun's arguments in this chapter, I came away with the sense that Hassoun is somewhat inattentive to public choice considerations. There may be a good theoretical case for protectionism in some instances. But it is unclear whether the political institutions of many developing countries are capable of implementing protectionist policies in a way that would actually benefit the poor and avoid capture by special interests.[5] This suggests a more general problem. In this chapter and the chapter on foreign aid, Hassoun has a tendency to recommend policies without considering the background institutional environment. A certain policy might be a good idea in isolation, but this policy could become a bad idea in an environment where political actors have little incentive to competently implement it.

In chapter 6, Hassoun defends a proposal for promoting more equitable access to essential technologies and pharmaceuticals. The idea is that a rating agency would evaluate the policies and investments of companies. If these companies help poor people to access pharmaceuticals and essential technologies or develop new drugs that address the needs of the poor, then the rating agency would gives these companies permission to attach a "Fair Trade Bio" label to their products. Ethical consumers would buy more products from these companies and this would further encourage companies to improve access to drugs and technologies. This is a genuinely novel and interesting idea. I hope it receives more attention in policy debates about how to address global poverty.

Overall, Hassoun's arguments in the second part of the book are reasonable and balanced. However, there is a curious omission in her discussion. She never discusses immigration policy. Although social scientists continue to disagree about the effects of foreign aid and trade, they generally agree that more liberal immigration policies would reduce global poverty. For example, the economist Michael Clemens surveys the existing empirical literature on the effects of immigration and finds that:

The gains from eliminating migration barriers dwarf -- by an order of a magnitude or two -- the gains from eliminating other types of barriers. For the elimination of trade policy barriers and capital flow barriers, the estimated gains amount to less than a few percent of world GDP. For labor mobility barriers, the estimated gains are often in the range of 50-150 percent of world GDP.[6]

In other words, open borders could more than double the size of the world economy. This would surely help reduce global poverty -- most of the gains from immigration go to the members of developing countries. I suspect that more immigration would have significantly greater benefits than the policies that Hassoun recommends.[7] Although there is only so much one can do in a book of this size, it is nonetheless surprising that Hassoun never discusses the potent anti-poverty effects of immigration.

Let's sum up. Hassoun's argument for the conclusion that legitimacy justifies positive duties to the global poor appears to be unsuccessful. Moreover, her discussion of public policy neglects important policy options and tends to operate in an institutional vacuum. Despite these reservations, Globalization and Global Justice is a stimulating book. Hassoun deserves commendation in particular for her sustained engagement with empirical debates over trade and foreign aid and for her innovative policy proposals.

[1] Hassoun gives a slightly different version of this argument in chapter 3. She calls this "the legitimacy argument" (p. 92). But, as far as I can tell, these arguments are nearly identical.

[2] It could be the case that the same interests ground both positive and negative rights. For instance, my interest in bodily integrity might ground both a negative right against assault and a positive right to protection. But this is different from the claim that negative rights entail positive rights.

[3] Hassoun never mentions compensation, but she does say that libertarians are committed to the view that "there is a conditional remedial obligation to ensure that those subject to coercive rules secure sufficient autonomy" (p. 92). The word "remedial" here possibly suggests compensation.

[4] See, for instance: Nicolas Van de Walle, African Economies and the Politics of Permanent Crisis (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001), chapter 5; and Tim Hartford and Michael Klein, "Aid and the Resource Curse," World Bank Public Policy Journal (2005), pp. 1-4.

[5] Hassoun does consider the objection that some people may justify protectionism in the name of the poor, even when protectionism does not in fact help the poor (pp. 163-5). But my worry is different. My worry is that, once trade restrictions are in place, there will be a constituency that has a powerful interest in keeping these restrictions in place regardless of whether they continue to benefit the poor or not.

[6] Michael Clemens, "Economics and Emigration: Trillion-Dollar Bills on the Sidewalk?" Journal of Economic Perspectives 25 (2011), p. 84.

[7] For a comparison between immigration and other policies that aim to reduce poverty, see Michael A. Clemens, Claudio Montenegro, and Lant Pritchett, "The Place Premium: Wage Differences for Identical Workers Across the US Border," Center for Global Development Working Paper 148 (2008).