Globalizing Democracy and Human Rights

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Carol C. Gould, Globalizing Democracy and Human Rights, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 288pp $ 24.99 (pbk), ISBN 05541271.

Reviewed by John S. Dryzek, Australian National University


Carol Gould builds a complex democratic edifice from a number of pillars. The pillars include a commitment to justice and human rights, a feminist ethic of care and empathy, recognition of the body as fundamental to politics, and a social ontology that sees individuals as constituted in particular social settings, but also capable of agency in these settings. The rights in question are cultural and economic as well as the familiar range of protections against arbitrary government and other members of society. Readers looking for simplicity and parsimony will not find it in these pages. Gould takes on a complex set of interconnected questions with a complex and interconnected set of arguments. This however a fully justifiable intellectual strategy, and the payoffs in terms of insights generated are substantial.

The applications to particular questions are numerous and varied. Gould contemplates issues of moral universalism and cultural relativism, racism, group rights, women's rights, global democracy, globalization, stakeholder participation in the management of private corporations, the internet, and terrorism. Notably, she combines treatments of democracy and justice, which for most theorists generally belong in separate boxes. On most of the topics taken on in this book she brings a distinctive and original viewpoint to bear. When it comes to cultural difference, Gould criticizes universalistic norms, but steers clear of relativism by proposing 'intersociative' norms that are generated in cross-cultural interaction. Empathy and solidarity will normally play substantial roles in the generation of these norms. The result is ultimately a kind of universalism -- but not one based simply on contemplation of universal human needs, desires, and characteristics from a standpoint that suggests that all people have the same characteristics and basic needs. Here she takes issue with Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum in particular, arguing against their capabilities approach, which Gould believes is in the end itself culturally specific, despite its claims to universality. Her approach to racism notes the degree to which democratic theory has often ignored race, and so has ignored the problems majority rule can present for racial minorities. These problems can actually be less pressing in consensual political systems (such as those developed in a number of North European countries), which try to integrate all major social interests in decision making structures. Gould is more concerned with the problems presented when it comes to race by adversarial systems such as the United States. She has plenty of time for group rights, which she grounds in individual rights with a social ontology twist. She has less time for nations and nationalism, evident in particular in her transnational approach to the identification and construction of democratic communities.

There is extensive discussion in the book of democracy above and across the level of the state, an area traditionally ignored in democratic theory but recently receiving substantial attention, especially from cosmopolitans (who are discussed at length) and Habermasian critical theorists (who are hardly mentioned). Distancing herself from cosmopolitans such as David Held, Gould rejects a 'democracy of the affected' standard for the construction and delimitation of authoritative political bodies transcending national boundaries. Instead, she favors a 'common activity' standard for the construction of demoi, conceptualized in terms of self-determination for those engaged in a common enterprise. Transnational publics would form around particular issues, and be the target of democratization. This approach 'bases the requirement for democracy on the equal rights of individuals to participate in decisions concerning frameworks of common activity defined by shared goals' (p. 163). This standard begs a number of questions concerning its implementation, for it would on the face of it lead to multiple and fluid demoi, very different from the sorts of authoritative and territory-based (even if that territory can be global) institutional proposals of the cosmopolitans. A question also arises when goals are not shared, and indeed may be diametrically opposed, and any sense of common enterprise denied by all concerned. Here transnational democracy may be largely a matter of conflict resolution.

Given the variety of topics covered and the contentiousness of some of the views offered upon them, it would be hard for any reader to agree with all of the arguments that Gould makes. This reader found the discussion of terrorism in particular unconvincing, mostly because the analysis is developed through the lens of empathy, which as Gould points out is conspicuously missing in terrorists themselves. She believes that empathy should be required of the rest of us in understanding the unjust and oppressive conditions in which those who support terrorism often live. The feminist focus on empathy leads Gould to a condemnation of hierarchy and patriarchy in terrorist formations. But when on p. 261 Gould refers to 'powerful leaders who undemocratically instruct the foot soldiers what to do' as being at the core of terrorism, she gets it precisely wrong -- joining in her error those who favor a militarized response to terrorism in imagining hierarchy in the enemy. Of course, militarists of this sort make strange company for Gould, especially in light of their manifest hostility to the very idea of empathy. Yet In today's world al Qaeda (for example) is more a brand than an organization; it has no need to recruit, and no capacity to direct from any hierarchical center. It is commonplace to describe al Qaeda as a network as opposed to a hierarchy, but in fact it is hardly even a network. It coordinates by disseminating a discourse, not issuing commands. There are democratic means of engaging the discourse that would have their roots in transnational civil society's opposition to the hazards imposed on the world by terrorists and counter-terrorists alike, that would try to reconstruct the discursive field surrounding terrorism. What Gould proposes is a bit different. Hers looks to be more of a 'hearts and minds' strategy, empathizing with the sufferings of those on whose behalf terrorists claim to act, and presumably contributing to the redress of their grievances, but otherwise not registering the discourse of terrorists.

Globalizing Democracy and Human Rights is wide-ranging, thought-provoking, and challenging. There is plenty here to interest political theorists concerned with democracy and justice, human rights, cultural difference, women's issues, economic organization, technology, and the international system. On all these issues, Gould's voice is powerful and original.