Gnostic Return in Modernity and Gnostic Apocalypse

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O'Regan, Cyril, Gnostic Return in Modernity, State University of New York Press, 2001, 311 pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7914-5022-8.

O'Regan, Cyril, Gnostic Apocalypse. Jacob Boehme's Haunted Narrative, State University of New York Press, 2002, 300 pp, $20.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7914-5202-6.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin


As with many other technical terms in philosophy (e.g. ‘Neoplatonism’, ‘idealism’), gnosticism is of modern provenance, and refers to a disparate group of mythico-religous texts that purport to offer a saving knowledge (gnosis) to the select band of enlightened ones. Gnostic traces can be found in early Christianity, Judaism and Hellenism, and, although it claims an older lineage, it is usually dated to the second century A.D. For millennia, what was known of gnosticism was mediated for the most part through hostile sources, most notably the early Christian Fathers (Irenaeus, Tertullian, Clement), but also pagan intellectual sources such as Plotinus’ Ennead II.9, which seeks to counter the gnostic view that the creator of the world was evil. However, even in early Christianity, matters were complex, such that an anti-gnostic writer like Clement of Alexandria can regularly invoke the notion of gnostike theoria in a positive sense.

In the twentieth century new discoveries of gnostic documents – such as the Berlin Codex and the Nag Hammadi collections in Egypt – provided a huge stimulus to scholarly knowledge, although new controversies erupted over the nature and status of the texts, the editions, the manner in which the texts have been publicized or suppressed, as well as their relation with more orthodox Christian documents. But, in general, even gnostic texts which appear to supplement New Testament stories seem written in a different and to us now quite alien register, full of myth and complexity and personified concepts. We are in the realm of the sacred and the arcane.

In the nineteenth century, certain German Protestant theologians (notably Harnack, Baur, Staudenmaier) made efforts to chart the history of gnosticism and to point to elements which have survived into modernity (in Renaissance interest in hermeticism and in magic, in Romantic revivals of myth and so on). Moreover, some German scholars began to claim that there are broadly ‘gnostic’ elements in modernity. These scholars ranged from neo-Hegelian theologians in the nineteenth century to twentieth century philosophers of culture, specifically, Carl Jung who collected gnostic texts as evidence of the existence of universal archetypes; Hans Jonas, who draws Heidegger into the orbit of gnosticism; Hans Blumenberg who focuses on religious elements in his account of the birth of the modern age; and Eric Voegelin, who in his efforts to defend genuine transcendence thinks everything modern is gnostic. Undoubtedly there are gnostic currents running though western Christian culture, and these currents could be charted more precisely, in view of some rather exaggerated claims made by Eric Voegelin and others. It is a worthwhile though necessarily limited task to determine how useful it is to attach the label ‘gnostic’ to a text, trend or movement in theology, philosophy, or literature.

As part of this scholarly project to understand gnosticism, there is obviously a need to assess these (predominantly German) claims that there are ‘gnostic’ elements in modernity. This is the task Cyril O’Regan sets himself in the two books reviewed here, presented as the first in a projected series of seven! Seven books identifying and pinning down gnosticism in modernity! Is gnosticism so important? So prevalent? Why exactly is it important to trace the lineage of gnosticism? Why is it more important than, say, knowing about Stoic or Neoplatonic elements in modern thought. It seems to me that the urge to identify gnostic currents and gnostic thinkers is driven by other than purely historical motives. It soon becomes clear that we are not in fact analyzing the nature of ‘modernity’ in the sense of the usual themes of the rise of exact science, the disenchantment of the world, the move from closed world to infinite universe and so on. Nor are we charting the influences on moderns such as Bacon, Galileo, Descartes, Locke or Kant. In fact, we are squarely in the realm of theology. A brief perusal of the literature shows that, aside from the study of the original gnostic texts, the term ‘gnostic’ is used as a pejorative label for any kind of claim to independent or complete knowledge of the world which does not defer to faith (usually Catholic but more generally some orthodox variety).

Early in his first book in the series, Gnostic Return in Modernity (p. 6), O’Regan quotes another scholar of gnosticism, Ioan Culianu, bemoaning the fact that everyone is a gnostic according to someone:

Not only was Gnosis gnostic, but the catholic authors were gnostic, the neoplatonists too, Reformation was gnostic, Communism was gnostic, Nazism was gnostic, liberalism, existentialism and psychoanalysis were gnostic too, modern biology was gnostic, Blake, Yeats, Kafka, Rilke, Proust, Joyce, Musil, Hesse and Thomas Mann were gnostic. From very authoritative interpreters of Gnosis, I learned further that science is gnostic and superstition is gnostic … Hegel is gnostic and Marx is gnostic; Freud is gnostic and Jung is gnostic; all things and their opposite are equally gnostic.

I must say I agree with Culianu; it seems that anyone who puts forward a systematic account (Hegel, Marx, Heidegger) can be defined as a gnostic. It is not a neutral term but carries some sense of flawed, Faustian, overweaning ambition. Even if the term is current in contemporary theology and literary theory, it is of little value (in philosophy certain terms like ‘reductionist’ have similar broad currency, but I doubt if anyone is planning a seven-volume systematic work on all possible forms of reductionism and their interrelation). Nor can one be confident that a systematic study over seven volumes won’t itself end up being labeled gnostic in the light of its Faustian ambitions. O’Regan offers learned and sophisticated assessments of various versions of gnosticism, but I have some worries when the candidates for gnosticism turn out to be many of the names on Culianu’s list – Boehme, Blake, Hegel and so on. Rather than letting everything be sucked into the gnostic fold, it might have been a good idea to look at counter-movements and tendencies. Otherwise, we are in a world of self-selected and self-confirming evidences.

O’Regan himself is fully conscious of the deep problems in utilizing a term as vague and polysemic as gnosticism as a diagnostic tool in investigating the meaning of modernity. Furthermore, he begins from the assumption that all previous attempts to apply the gnostic label to modernity have failed, including what he regards as the best attempt – that of the neo-Hegelian philosopher and theologian Ferdinand Christian Baur (1792-1860) in his Die christliche Gnosis (1835). O’Regan agrees with Baur’s attempt to discover revivals of gnosticism in modernity, and also agrees with him in beginning from Jacob Boehme. However, Baur is otherwise too dated and working within the limitations of his time regarding access to gnostic texts. So it is necessary to carry out a Baurian analysis all over again. As Regan puts it (sounding suspiciously triadic): to “do Baur again”, to “redo” him and to “undo” him. However, O’Regan still wants to retain the term ‘gnostic’ and is suspicious of those who either replace it or merge it with the term ‘apocalyptic’ or ‘Neoplatonic’. He has an undoubted eye for complexity and does not shirk from offering his own technical vocabulary to identify what he takes to be typical elements of gnostic narrative (e.g. ‘metalepsis’, ‘apocalyptic inscription’, ‘distention’, ‘horizontalization’).

We are revisiting the conceptual and historical frameworks of nineteenth-century (and some twentieth-century) theologians, to see both how they handled gnosticism and to see how much gnostic narratives are surviving in their own very approaches. Perhaps such an exercise is important for understanding the course of modern theology, and specifically modern Protestantism. In this sense it is a project of revisionary theology. But, why exactly do we need to revive the approach of Baur? Why do we need to carry out his project again, especially as ‘modernity’ for O’Regan has now been expanded to include even anti-gnostic discourses in twentieth century theology (including the Catholic theologian, Hans Urs von Balthasar). Despite the projected seven books and the huge scale of the proposed work, it rapidly becomes clear that in fact we are dealing with an extremely narrow project – namely investigating the suitability of using the diagnostic term ‘gnosticism’ for identifying aspects of the nineteenth- and twentieth-century Christian theological tradition. O’Regan himself makes clear that his purpose is theological: “my main concern in prosecuting a third line of Protestant discourses in modernity is to make a contribution to theology” (Gnostic Return, p. 9). Gnosticism is usually contrasted with ‘orthodox’ Christianity, as if such a notion were itself clear, perspicacious and invariant. O’Regan operates with distinctions between ‘gnostic’, ‘orthodox’ and ‘liberal’ versions of Protestantism (he usually invokes ‘Catholicism’ in a more monolithic manner as anti-gnostic tout court). O’Regan allows himself a footnote where he contrasts inauthentic with authentic Christianity but nowhere does he elucidate what he means by ‘authentic’ Christianity. What he wants to do (following Baur) is diagnose the gnostic current running between the orthodox and liberal models. On the one hand, he wants to hold with the theologian Hans Frei that biblical narrative has lost its grip on modernity and yet he wants to find gnostic versions of a quasi-religious narrative everywhere. O’Regan acknowledges from the outset that he sides with Irenaeus in generally thinking that gnosticism is a bad thing and that its return in modernity is to be mourned rather than celebrated. Yet O’Regan thinks Voegelin and others go too far in using the term ‘gnostic’ in a “polemical and pathological” way (Gnostic Return, p. 25).

In Gnostic Return in Modernity O’Regan sets out to develop a conceptual theoretical model of gnostic discourse that can be used as a kind of template against which to measure various suspect discourses found in modernity. In this sense, he thinks he is making a contribution not just to theology and philosophy, but to literary theory, by having a general model of how narratives work and how they transform into other narratives (actually if he could abstract some of the things he has to say about narratives, he might be onto something here). His thesis is simple and bold: that there is such a thing as a ‘Valentinian gnostic’ grammar for reading narratives, and that, despite lack of actual contact, such narrative structures reappear (deformed and reformed) in certain modern discourses. The approach then is broadly structuralist and hermeneutical. O’Regan thinks there is a grand narrative – Western Christian tradition—whose complex moments can helpfully be diagnosed by identifying various forms of gnostic emplotment, as it were. To this end, O’Regan draws up a set of characteristics for a ‘Valentinian grammar’. He then proceeds to apply this grid to various texts in modernity.

What exactly is the purpose of developing a ‘conceptual model’ of a label in order to be able to sniff out gnostic elements in ‘discourses’ and ‘narratives’? To be fair, O’Regan himself exhibits some self-doubts concerning the legitimacy and wisdom of his enormous project. He allows himself to wonder whether devoting a whole book to Boehme is not “serious overkill”, “taking a machine gun to swat a fly” (Gnostic Apocalypse, p. 212). Indeed, O’Regan could have usefully spent more time in such a sceptical mode (scepticism too is an ancient tradition with modern revivals and transformations), because such self-conscious hesitations and doubts about the project appear at various moments in the text, are acknowledged, but it seems to me are never squarely addressed.

O’Regan wants to redress the balance with a ‘nonhyperbolic genealogical deployment of gnosticism’. This way of approaching gnosticism is to identify it with a certain structural or ‘grammatical’ way of handling texts. For example, it seems, on O’Regan’s view, that gnosticism implies a certain tendency to manipulate texts and especially the Christian theological story in ways which ‘disfigure’ and ‘refigure’ it. O’Regan calls this disfiguring-refiguring characteristic ‘metaleptic’. Metalepsis is a characteristic way in which Gnostics treat narratives. O’Regan then sets out to find this characteristic in various other narrative forms. But again, he makes the issue more complex. Metalepsis is not found at a ‘single strength’ but in varying degrees in different narratives.

The problem is that, despite the immensity of the project and its myriad details, these books operate at a level of meta-theory. Instead of close readings of gnostic and modern texts, we get extraordinary systematic pronouncements on the meta-level, where concepts, not humans, seem to do all the work. We seem to be in a world where geological and engineering terms are applied to the manner concepts intertwine with one another. I cite some examples. Having decided that there is ‘six-pointed narrative’ at work in Valentinian gnosticism, O’Regan offers a characterization of how that narrative is at work in Boehme:

The six-stage narrative has a theogonic drift, whose background is supplied by teleological optics, and whose foreground consists of erotic, kenotic and agonistic figuration.

Never mind the triad of erotic, kenotic and agonistic, what is a ‘teleological optics’ and how can it supply background to a ‘theogonic drift’? In his acknowledgements, O’Regan thanks Gene Outka for his efforts to get him to write “in something like English prose”. Outka may have struggled, but O’Regan always won. Here are some examples of his prose (chosen at random):

To speak of the possibility of genealogical supplementarity is in no way to reintroduce multiple genealogical ascription, for supplementarity implies that one genealogical ascription, in this instance, Valentinian Gnosticism, can be regarded as determinative in the last instance. (Gnostic Return, p. 83).

Or again:

The ontological generosity so central to Neoplatonism is translated in this narrative environment into the ungrounded will to manifestation that has erotic momentum. The dramatic agon between the divine and the antidivine is undergirded by telos, such that continuity redresses the rupture of manifestation brought about by the emergence of the antidivine. Indeed, the teleological graphing justifies rupture of communication of the divine and the emergence of the antidivine. (Gnostic Return, p. 211).

And so on and on for close to 600 pages (taking the first two books together). The form and length of these two books suggest that O’Regan is struggling to put form on his topic. Hence, the need to insert summaries at the ends of chapters, and the pointing forward and backward to what he claims to have established and what still needs establishing. There is a great amount of repetition. I also suspect, from the references to the further five volumes, that what we will get in future volumes is more of the same. There are enough hints about what the reading of Hegel will be, that I am not sure we need to wait for the book.

I must admit, that as a philosopher, I approached these books with a sense of excitement and put them down with a sense of bewilderment and disappointment. O’Regan displays enormous erudition and a great sensitivity to hermeneutic issues. He clearly has a deep sense that Gnostic myths can be analyzed structurally in terms of their narrative ‘grammar’ and that such a grammatical analysis can be usefully applied to theological and literary narratives, among others. But, the attempt to build a systematic theory and to develop ways of using concepts that depend so much on differentiating them from the same concepts as used by different authors, means that we are operating at a rarified level far from the texts themselves. Even if one succeeded in sharpening Baur’s account to fit the knowledge available currently about the western theological tradition, what is the end result? Philosophers will, I think, breathe a sigh of relief that modern philosophy followed Descartes and not Boehme, and that philosophy separated itself from theology.