God and Being: An Enquiry

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George Pattison, God and Being: An Enquiry, Oxford University Press, 2011, 350pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588688.

Reviewed by Kevin Hart, The University of Virginia / The Australian Catholic University


On picking up a new book entitled God and Being: An Enquiry, one might well expect a serious reflection on Erich Przywara’s teaching of the analogia entis, perhaps in relation to Karl Barth’s intense distrust of the notion. Or one might anticipate a new defense of Aquinas’s idea of God as ipsum esse subsistens omnibus modis indeterminatum by a Thomist of one stripe or another. Or one could be about to read a volume that freshly considers Heidegger’s case for distinguishing God and being, since, after all, being (as Heidegger conceives it) is a finite category and unable to be used with respect to the deity. We may experience God in the dimension of being, Heidegger says, but we have no right to think of God as being itself. Or we might think that this new book will take its bearings from Emmanuel Lévinas, for whom it is wrongheaded to associate God and being: we should bracket the phenomenality of revelation and restrict ourselves to recognizing the trace of the divine as we approach the other person. Yet again, one might expect a close reading of Jean-Luc Marion’s proposal, beautifully encapsulated in the title of his book Dieu sans l’être (1982), that we should think of God without being, or without being “God” (as metaphysical theologians have construed him) and that, rather than taking “being” as the first of the divine names, we should return to a more venerable tradition, that of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, in which the first of the divine names is the good.

If we read George Pattison’s book hoping it will be any one of these possible studies, we shall be disappointed. Chances are that we shall be disappointed anyway. Certainly no philosopher, in either the analytic or the continental school, will be satisfied by it. It simply does not meet the high standards of clarity and rigor that philosophers have come to expect. Nor are theologians likely to be impressed: there is no grappling with Scripture, no close engagement with the Christian theological tradition or penetrating discussion of any problem that comes out of it. The author admits that he is “a scholar neither of medieval nor of classical thought” (10) and offers himself instead as thinking alongside, and by way of, a number of modern and contemporary European thinkers, some whom I have already named and others whom I have not: Hegel, Kierkegaard, Sartre, Jankélévitch, and Derrida. I doubt that it is possible for a theologian to excuse himself so quickly from the responsibility to know the Fathers and the great medieval theologians. Still, to be able to engage modern and contemporary European thought on being, and to relate it to the question of God, would be no small thing.

Pattison says that he began to write this book in the heyday of the “new atheism” of Richard Dawkins and Christopher Hitchens. Bluntly thought, often with a crude understanding of Christianity, the new atheism has been of more importance as a rhetorical phenomenon than an intellectual one. In the teeth of polemics that God does not exist, Pattison has sought to offer something (“what, for want of a better word, might be called philosophical reflection” (1)) that would satisfy the spiritual and intellectual hungers of many people in Britain and, presumably, elsewhere. These are people who find no nourishment in the fast food of fundamentalism or what passes for evangelicalism in the English-speaking world, and for whom Catholicism and Orthodoxy are overly demanding, unapproachable, or incredible. He is entirely right to identify that hunger, although whether his reflection can satisfy it is another question.

God and Being is an “enquiry” into the coupling and possible uncoupling of the two words. In general, Pattison follows Heidegger in detaching “being” from “God,” focusing on the language required for making ontic and ontological statements and on the human subject whose “bodily events . . . simply are the way in which our being religious occurs” (271). Pattison aligns himself with Gianni Vattimo’s notion of the “weakening” or “softening” of being, which I have considered in an earlier notice in Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, and with the rethinking of God by way of possibility rather than actuality. Contemporary European philosophy of religion tends to fall into two main camps. On the one hand, there are Jean-Luc Marion, Jean-Louis Chrétien, Michel Henry, Jean-Yves Lacoste and Emmanuel Falque, among others, who are seeking to rethink phenomenology so that it can deal adequately with Christian revelation. There are differences between these writers, sometimes quite considerable ones, yet in general we might say that they are concerned to preserve the phenomenality of God. On the other hand, one finds John D. Caputo, Jacques Derrida, Richard Kearney, and Vattimo, among others, who accept the postmodern critique of ontology, have no great wish to preserve the Christianity of Nicaea and Chalcedon, and yet have a stake in a weaker post-modern version of the faith. Pattison pitches his tent squarely in this second camp. To the left of him, as it were, are Don Cupitt and the more impressive Jean-Luc Nancy: neither believes at all in the God whom Christians worship.

Pattison is aware of the phenomenological camp, though only in a blurry way. He makes no mention of Chrétien, Henry, Falque, Lacoste or any of the others (such as Vincent Carraud, Didier Franck, and Robert Sokolowski). The main person with whom he is in conversation is Marion, though all we are given is a superficial and inconsequential relict of part of Étant donné (1997). One might have expected close attention to the saturated phenomenon, especially to the claim that revelation is saturation to the second degree; and since Pattison evokes the controversy over the nature of the gift, it is strange that he never quite comes to grips with the different cases that Derrida and Marion propose about the gift. In general, Pattison approaches a question only to leave it pretty much as it was. This is so even in what is probably the showcase of the book, the discussion of possibility and actuality. How odd that Pattison does not engage Eberhard Jüngel’s “The World as Possibility and Actuality” (1969), among other later pieces. In general, to read this book is to be introduced to thinkers who are, by and large, “helpful” (to quote one of his favorite words), but helpful to no clear end. Only seldom does Pattison differ sharply from anyone: John Milbank clearly raises his hackles.

When I read this book for a second time, I thought that perhaps it could be of use to undergraduate students in modern theology. Unfortunately, I don’t think that it can serve that purpose. Pattison is simply not sufficiently careful. For example, he points out the significance of Heidegger’s notion of the “onto-theological constitution of metaphysics” (3), but does not indicate that what Heidegger has in mind here is strictly the onto-theio-logical constitution of metaphysics. The reference is Aristotle’s notion of the theion, the highest ground, not to ho theos, the God. Without this initial clarification, any unwary reader is likely to think that Heidegger is claiming that ontology and theology are mixed together. Instead, Heidegger proposes that Christian thinking goes awry when a certain philosophical structure of thought enters it. Later, on p. 102, Pattison glosses what Heidegger means by “Dasein”: “the subject that we ourselves are”). Now this does not take us very deeply into Heidegger’s thought, and it is misleading in the extreme to think of Dasein as a continuation of the philosophy of the subject. As Lacoste (a philosopher who knows Heidegger very well indeed) says, very clearly, “Dasein is nothing but doors and windows.”1

A third and final example of misunderstanding: on p. 263 we are told of “Derrida’s distinctive prioritizing of writing over speaking.” Pattison is immediately concerned to defend Derrida from any supposed devaluation of the lived body, and yet he gets Derrida’s main point quite wrong. Derrida affirms the priority of a quasi-transcendental structure, archi-écriture, over both phenomenal script and phenomenal speech. It is archi-écriture that is Derrida’s version of the “‘pre-existent’ constitution” [“vor-seienden” Konstitution] that Fink requires if Husserlian phenomenology is to be saved. Derrida is less concerned with saving transcendental phenomenology, however, than redirecting it towards grammatology: the study of differing and deferring rather than phenomenal script.

In the end, then, it is hard to know who would profit from God and Being: An Enquiry. It does not make a contribution to research, and it lacks the convincing detail that would make it of use to students and lay readers of Christian theology.

1 Jean-Yves Lacoste, Experience and the Absolute: Disputed Questions on the Humanity of Man, trans. Mark Raftery-Skehan (New York: Fordham University Press, 2004), 11.