God and Cosmos: Moral Truth and Human Meaning

Placeholder book cover

David Baggett and Jerry L. Walls, God and Cosmos: Moral Truth and Human Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2016, 329pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199931217.

Reviewed by Christian B. Miller, Wake Forest University


David Baggett and Jerry L. Walls describe their latest book as a companion to their earlier Good God (OUP 2011). In their prior work, they had outlined a version of divine command theory about deontological moral properties, while appealing to God's character to ground axiological properties. They also defended their account against objections. Here, their project is rather different: "This book is our effort to advance a cumulative abductive moral argument for God's existence" (8). The result is a very lively and interesting discussion of why, on their view, the existence of a theistic God best explains a number of facets of the moral life.

First, I briefly clarify in more detail Baggett and Walls's project of offering an abductive moral argument. Second, I give a quick overview of the different facets of the moral life they consider, and also mention the competing secular accounts of those facets which they ultimately find less promising than theism. Finally, I end with a few observations.

Baggett and Walls are engaged in the project of trying to argue for the existence of God. The 'god' in question is the god of Western monotheism. At times, Baggett and Walls are more specific still, invoking a Christian conception of God and distinctively Christian commitments like the Trinity.

Their argument is a moral argument in that the data which serves as its basis is specifically moral data. It is abductive in that, on the basis of the moral data, the argument proceeds via inference to the best explanation. The main competing explanations to theism Baggett and Walls consider are contemporary secular accounts of the moral data. They conclude that the theistic account has "superior explanatory power" (19) to the various secular accounts they review.

Baggett and Walls are suitably modest about their project. They stress several times that they are not able to consider every leading secular account on offer. Furthermore, they grant that the best secular accounts have much to say in their favor, and often do provide a rich explanatory story. It is just that these accounts are -- comparatively speaking -- not as plausible as the theistic account, when judged using various criteria for assessing competing explanations. And finally, they do not take themselves to be offering an argument for the existence of God which is either conclusive or comprehensive. As they write,

what we can infer is limited in certain respects. First, perhaps morality increases the likelihood of theism but only by a marginal amount. Second, it should be said in such a case that the probability of theism has increased (by much or a little) relative to morality; in theory the probability of atheism could increase or decrease relative to other phenomena (20, emphasis theirs).

The argument developed by Baggett and Walls is abductive, moral, and -- let me now add -- cumulative. There is not just one piece of moral data that they use in weighing different explanatory stories. Rather they focus on at least the following five different facets of morality -- moral value, moral obligation, moral knowledge, moral transformation, and moral rationality -- and argue that with respect to each facet, a theistic explanation comes out ahead. I will expand on each of these a bit more in the next section.

Moral arguments for God's existence have been around for a long time, and they have taken many forms. A common alternative approach is deductive rather than abductive. In chapter two, Baggett and Walls make their case for why they do not go down that road. In particular they consider at great length the following argument by William Lane Craig:

1. If God does not exist, then objective moral values and duties do not exist.
2. Objective moral values and duties do exist.
3. So, God exists (63).

Baggett and Walls have much to say about this argument, but the gist of their discussion is "not that Craig's argument is a bad or unsound argument, but rather that it is relatively unpersuasive to many committed atheists" (64).

I will not evaluate their dispute with Craig here. I only mention Craig's argument as a helpful contrast in further illustrating the distinctive approach Baggett and Walls have adopted.

Chapters 4-8 are the heart of the book, and in each chapter we find Baggett and Walls assessing secular accounts of one of the five different facets of the moral life. Let me briefly summarize what each facet is, and mention the particular secular accounts they consider. I won't try, though, to summarize what they say about each of them.

Before beginning, it is important to note a crucial assumption that Baggett and Walls are very explicit about and which does a lot of work for them in focusing their discussion: "We are not going to spend time refuting relativists and subjectivists in this book. Nor postmoderns and moral perspectivalists. We are going to take on naturalists and secularists who wish to retain their convictions about objective moral truth" (2). In other words, the comparative assessment of explanations is only between theistic supernaturalism and secular moral realist views. They claim that they will take up anti-realist views, which on their taxonomy includes constructivist, error theoretic, and expressivist positions, in future work.

The first moral facet is introduced in chapter 4 under the heading of moral value. Rather than discuss goodness in general, Baggett and Walls focus specifically on intrinsic human value, which is closely linked in the chapter to inviolable human dignity and basic human rights. The main secular accounts considered are utilitarianism, Philippa Foot's account in Natural Goodness, and Erik J. Wielenberg's non-naturalist approach in Robust Ethics.

In the next chapter, Baggett and Walls turn to moral obligations, which they understand in a robust way as categorical requirements with authority and inescapability. Here the naturalistic accounts considered are Frans de Waal's biological approach, Scott James's evolutionary ethic, David Brink's version of Cornell realism, and a generic form of non-naturalist moral realism.

The facet in chapter 6 is moral knowledge, and the question is about the comparative plausibility of secular accounts of how we can come to know objective moral truths. Here Baggett and Walls raise a host of different arguments and challenges, but evolutionary debunking arguments figure prominently throughout and are discussed in relation to both Cornell realist and non-naturalist approaches.

Chapter 7 takes up moral transformation. Here is their central thesis:

In light of what seem to be some deeply entrenched patterns of selfishness and moral weakness endemic to the human condition, secular theories of morality feature severely limited resources to effect the deep moral transformation that we need and that morality itself seems to require (214).

Some of the secular accounts discussed in this chapter fall under the heading of utilitarianism (Shelly Kagan) and feminist ethics (Carol Gilligan).

Finally, chapter 8 is devoted to moral rationality, which is glossed mainly as having to do with the relationship between morality and self-interest. Baggett and Walls's case study here involves someone who is morally required to sacrifice her own life at the expense of her self-interest. The main proposals receiving critical treatment are C. S. Lewis's account of the Tao in The Abolition of Man, and Sidgwick's dualism of practical reason.

Having outlined these five facets of the moral life and explored some of the weaknesses of secular accounts, Baggett and Walls conclude their book in chapter 9 by returning to each facet and offering a very brief sketch of how a theistic account would go instead. For instance, in the case of moral obligations Baggett and Walls refer to the divine command theory they have already developed in their previous book.

Let me conclude with a few observations. The first is meant to be a friendly revision to what Baggett and Walls take the conclusion of their abductive argument to be. Sometimes it is put this way (e.g., 8, 272, 274, 290, 300):

(C1) Given a realist approach to moral facts, theism provides the best explanation for five different facets of morality.

The first clause is important, since Baggett and Walls are clear that they are not trying to show, at least in this book, that theism offers a better account of these facets than does any competing view out there in contemporary metaethics.

Nevertheless, even granting all the arguments in this book, (C1) overreaches. For there are alternatives besides theism and atheism. Versions of Daoism and Confucianism which accept an objective morality would have to be considered. Same with deistic, pantheistic, and panentheistic approaches.

This point becomes magnified when on occasion Baggett and Walls advance an even stronger conclusion (e.g., 8, 272):

(C2) Given a realist approach to moral facts, Christian theism provides the best explanation for five different facets of morality.

But nowhere do they consider the comparative explanatory power of Judaism or Islam, for instance.

This is not to deny (C1) and (C2), but merely to note that what Baggett and Walls show (granting their arguments for the moment) can be put more carefully along the lines of the following (as they do in some places, e.g., 2, 72, 74):

(C3) Given a realist approach to moral facts, theism provides a better explanation for five different facets of morality than do some of the leading secular approaches in contemporary philosophy.

Of course, (C3) is still a bold and interesting claim. How well have they supported it?

With respect to some secular approaches, Baggett and Walls have plenty of sensible things to say, such as in criticizing de Waal's biological approach to moral obligation. When it comes to other approaches, though, I wish they had done a lot more work. The most glaring example is contemporary non-naturalism. Indeed, non-naturalism should arguably have been their main focus, at least when it comes to the facets of moral value and moral obligation. In many respects it is the secular meta-ethical approach that comes the closest to theism, and so needs to be explored in great detail to see what comparative explanatory disadvantages it is supposed to have. Yet leading non-naturalists like Terence Cuneo, Russ Shafer-Landau, and William FitzPatrick are not mentioned at all. Parfit is mentioned in passing, and David Enoch's work gets a page of discussion. Wielenberg's Robust Ethics receives the only sustained treatment.

To be fair, Baggett and Walls in some places say that they are raising challenges to secular non-naturalist views as such. So let's consider their challenge in the case of moral obligations. Like Baggett and Walls, non-naturalists typically accept the existence of objective moral facts about our obligations, where these obligations are authoritative and inescapable. And to support their view, they often draw parallels to other systems of obligation, such as logical or epistemic requirements, which also are authoritative and inescapable. If those requirements can exist objectively without a supernatural foundation, then why can't objective moral requirements do the same? Or so at least one often finds non-naturalists wondering (see, e.g., Shafer-Landau, Whatever Happened to Good and Evil?).

Baggett and Walls object as follows:

Both logical (and epistemic) and moral norms may all be authoritative, prescriptive, and unavoidable; but moral norms are, additionally, the sort of standards whose violation should make us feel guilty. We don't think of such guilt merely or primarily as a feeling . . . We see it as an objective moral condition (175).

Suppose they are right to point out a distinctive feature of objective moral norms that is not shared by other objective norms. What would follow? Why exactly would that show that secular non-naturalists are in trouble? Is the idea that objective moral guilt is a phenomenon that needs to be explained as well, and that secular non-naturalists do not have an explanation to offer whereas theists do (or at least, the secular non-naturalists' explanation is not as good of an explanation as the theists')? If so, this all needs to be spelled out a lot more.

And is it really true that moral norms are distinctive in this way? Baggett and Walls are explicit that they are not focusing on feelings of guilt, but rather on the objective condition of being guilty for some wrongdoing. But then why couldn't there be such an objective condition in the epistemic case as well, when for instance someone engages in epistemic akrasia? Indeed, I'm not even sure that there isn't a feeling of guilt that can arise in some cases of epistemic wrongdoing as well. And note that the same questions apply if one thinks that there are objective prudential norms as well. So I would be interested to hear much more about this line of reasoning.

The lack of engagement with contemporary non-naturalist views leads to the final point I want to make, which is about the audience for the book. On the one hand, it is likely going to be too challenging for the general public and for undergraduates in philosophy courses. On the other hand, Baggett and Walls don't engage in much detail with the leading work in meta-ethics today. In addition to the names mentioned above, Mark Schroeder, Michael Smith, Ralph Wedgwood, Peter Railton, Richard Boyd, Steve Darwall, Simon Blackburn, and Barbara Herman do not make an appearance. Tim Scanlon, Allan Gibbard, and Christine Korsgaard are mentioned by name but their work is not addressed. Of course not all these philosophers are moral realists, but they all have plenty to say which is relevant to assessing moral realist approaches.

My preference would have been to cut some of the material that seems more peripheral to the main argument, such as the quick history of secular thinking in chapter 1 and the material on the problem of evil in chapter 3. The core chapters in 4-8 could have been expanded in much greater detail. Finally, I suspect that rather than waiting until chapter 9 to see what the alternative theistic account is supposed to be for each of the five facets of morality, many readers would have appreciated that discussion appearing in each of the chapters devoted to a facet. Non-theistic readers in particular may also have been helped by more detail about what the theistic alternative is in each case.

Of course one can only do so much in one book, and the field of contemporary meta-ethics is a vast and difficult terrain. Baggett and Walls are to be commended for developing a very interesting and important line of reasoning that I hope they and others will continue to explore in the coming years.