God and Evidence: Problems for Theistic Philosopher

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Rob Lovering, God and Evidence: Problems for Theistic Philosophers, 2013, 160pp., Bloomsbury, $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441149435.

Reviewed by Clayton Littlejohn, King’s College London


Rob Lovering presents a series of related problems for theism. Most of these have to do with our epistemic predicament. The bulk of the book is spent arguing that the fact of nonbelief should lead us to abandon a variety of theistic views (i.e., theistic inferentialism, theistic noninferentialism, and theistic fideism). In the book’s final chapter, he argues against the coherence of theism by arguing that there could not be an essentially omniscient being. Lovering’s book is a welcome addition to the literature. His arguments are novel and forceful. The problems he discusses deserve careful consideration. I shall briefly summarize the main moves in the text and then point to two places where I think the theist can push back. Although his arguments might not establish conclusively that the theistic views he discusses are mistaken, they show that these views are deeply problematic.

In chapters 1-5, the discussion focuses on three theistic views:

·      Theistic Inferentialism: The view that there is inferential evidence that renders the hypothesis of theism probable and is discoverable in practice.

·      Theistic Noninferentialism: The view that there is noninferential evidence that renders the hypothesis of theism probable and is discoverable in practice.

·      Theistic Fideism: The view that there is no discoverable evidence that renders the hypothesis of theism probable but that it is nevertheless acceptable, morally, if not otherwise, to have faith in God’s existence (3).

Lovering thinks that nonbelievers presents a serious problem for the theists. The problem is not the familiar practical problem that it is often quite difficult to convert us. It is not the familiar epistemic problem that it is quite difficult to see how religious belief might be rational. The problem is that certain epistemic facts seem to be incompatible with two versions of theism (i.e., theistic inferentialism and noninferentialism), and a third version of theism that avoids these difficulties seems to be morally problematic.

The epistemic fact that causes trouble for theistic inferentialism is that the theistic inferentialists have failed to sway their skeptical epistemic counterparts. It is hard to reconcile this failure with the further claim that there is publically available evidence for theism that is sufficiently compelling and discoverable in practice.

Theistic inferentialists can offer various explanations to try to explain how the existence of sufficiently compelling existence can be compatible with the prevalent nonbelief we find in, say, our current philosophical community. Lovering runs through a number of familiar considerations (e.g., that the skeptics and atheists are intellectually inferior, that we are culpable for nonbelief, that God interferes with our acquiring and processing the evidence, etc.) and argues that none of these considerations helps us to understand how to square theistic inferentialism with the epistemic facts.

I expect that many theists will say that they have compelling evidence for their religious beliefs and will rightly stress that facts about disagreement cannot possibly show that the arguments for a contentious philosophical position are unsound. This is controversial, of course, but they might also be right to add that the presence of disagreement is compatible with the possibility that those of us who accept the relevant arguments can know that the arguments’ conclusions are true. While this sort of response might well be correct, it does not address an important dimension of the problem. If theism were true, shouldn’t we expect there to be a body of evidence that eliminates nonbelief and puts us all in a position to know that God exists so that we could enter into a meaningful relationship with God? Even if, say, our failure to be moved by the relevant arguments is a culpable failure, you might think that this cannot account for nonbelief. If theism were true, we would expect that it would be terribly significant to enter into a meaningful relationship with God, without which the nonbelievers would suffer a great deprivation, one that is surely not deserved for something as minor as, say, not being persuaded by the kinds of arguments familiar to all of us or for failing to dedicate more time to trying to improve upon these arguments or gather more evidence.

Some theistic noninferentialists will say that religious experience can justify the belief that God exists. Bracketing the question as to whether religious experience might have the stuff needed to justify a belief in God, the theistic noninferentialists face the problem of explaining why this evidence is scarcely, if ever, apprehended. If God is hidden from most of us, the theistic noninferentialists should explain why.

Lovering thinks that the theistic noninferentialists will appeal to the soul-making defense to try to account for God’s apparent absence from our lives. Those who offer such a defense think that divine hiddenness is important because divine presence would somehow compromise our freedom and so undermine our efforts to develop morally significant characters. Against this line of argument, Lovering argues (quite plausibly, I think) that God could be present without preventing us from making morally significant choices. If, say, God were present without presenting us with a series of commands and incentives, it seems that we could act freely and assume responsibility for our deeds and so the thought that God must remain hidden for us to develop our characters seems deeply implausible.

The last remaining option for the theist is theistic fideism. Fideists believe that it can be appropriate, morally or otherwise, to believe that God exists even if there is no discoverable evidence that renders theism probable. The theistic fideists recognize that they lack this evidence but see faith as nevertheless acceptable. Lovering argues that there is something morally problematic about faith because we have a prima facie duty to try to bring our beliefs in line with the evidence when they influence the way we interact with other

Lovering introduces a further epistemological problem for theism, the problem of skeptical theism. To respond to familiar arguments from evil, theists will likely want to concede that we cannot know what God would do in certain circumstances. Should theists accept broad skeptical theism (i.e., the view that we can never know what God would do) or adopt some narrower view? The broad skeptical view is unattractive because the three theistic views under consideration all assume that we can know what God would do in some situations (e.g., share evidence with us). The narrow view is unattractive because it leads to widespread skepticism. Ignorance is difficult to contain.

Lovering argues that theism is incoherent on the grounds that it posits the existence of an essentially omniscient being. He argues that it is logically impossible for something to be essentially omniscient. A natural thought about omniscience might be that the omniscient being has maximal propositional knowledge (i.e., knowledge of the truth value of propositions) and experiential knowledge (i.e., knowledge of what it is like to x). The basic argument is really an argument that there cannot be a being that is both propositionally and experientially omniscient on the grounds that (i) an experientially omniscient being would know what it’s like to not know the truth value of a proposition and (ii) such knowledge would require that the subject be less than propositionally omniscient.

Let me briefly discuss two areas where the theists might push back.

Let’s start with Lovering’s argument against the existence of an essentially omniscient being. If the name of the game is to defend the coherence of the idea of a maximally great being, the theist might not worry about an argument against the possibility of, say, essential omniscience unless that argument also purported to show that it is not possible for a maximally great being to exist. The theist will likely press Lovering to explain why maximal greatness should require experiential omniscience. (For what it’s worth, he does try to motivate the idea, but the discussion proceeds quite quickly.) Would God be less than maximally great if there was some x such that there is something it is like to x (e.g., stab a drifter, taste Marmite, not know the truth-value of p) where God does not know what it is like to x? For some values of x, I can see why someone might think that it is important for God to know what it is like to x. If God does not know what it is like to suffer, for example, God cannot show empathy. For some values, however, it isn’t at all clear why it would speak against God’s greatness that God doesn’t know what it is to x (e.g., not knowing what it is be stumped, confused, irrationally angry, etc.).

Now, Lovering has various responses to this worry including a revised argument targeted at the theists who want to deny that experiential omniscience is necessary for maximal greatness. I have a general worry about this entire line of argument that has to do with the notion of knowing what it is like to x. First, it is not clear whether you can know what it is like to visit Disneyland without having visited Disneyland. If a child visiting Disneyworld asked her parents what it is like to visit Disneyland, might they truthfully reply, ‘Oh, it’s just like this’? I think so. Suppose it is so. If so, then there is a gap between knowing what it is like to visit Disneyland and visiting Disneyland. Second, Lovering grants that it might be possible for God to perceive the content of someone’s consciousness (116). If that’s correct and knowing what it is like to x requires nothing more than, say, knowing the experiences someone has or would have if they were to x, it’s not clear what problem remains for the theist. In light of the first point, it is not a necessary condition on God’s knowing what it is like to not know the truth-value of a proposition that God lacks propositional knowledge. In light of the second point, God’s knowledge of other minds might be sufficient for experiential omniscience.

The take away lesson from chapters 1-3 is that non-fideist theists face the embarrassing problem that too many of us do not have sufficient evidence to believe that God exists. Like Lovering, I do not find the soul-making response terribly persuasive, but there is another response available that he does not consider. The nub of the problem for the non-fideist theists is that there is not enough evidence of God’s existence. While I have some sympathy for the idea that God would, if God existed, provide us with ample evidence of God’s existence, I don’t think Lovering has shown that there isn’t sufficient evidence available to us. The book does not discuss the evidence we’ll get when we’re dead.

This response might seem a bit glib, but if the theists already believe in an afterlife and believe that we’ll be acquainted with God in the afterlife, they can consistently say that God would provide all of us with sufficient evidence of God’s existence and concede that most of us will die without ever having acquired that evidence. While I think that it’s vitally important for all of us to get that evidence at some point (on the assumption that theism is true), why should it matter whether we get that evidence during the first hundred years of our eternal lives? If theists can appeal to the possibility of demons to try to undercut arguments from natural evil, why shouldn’t they try to undercut Lovering’s arguments by appeal to the possibility of acquiring evidence posthumously?

As I said earlier, there are places where I think the theist can put up resistance. Whether anyone would want to occupy the logical space that remains is another matter. While Lovering’s arguments might not conclusively refute the theistic views he considers, they do show that these positions will be incredibly difficult to defend. And that is no small achievement.