God and Evil in the Theology of St Thomas Aquinas

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Herbert McCabe, God and Evil in the Theology of St Thomas Aquinas, Brian Davies (ed.), Continuum, 2010, 205pp., $24.95 (pbk) ISBN 9780826413048.

Reviewed by John Haldane, University of St Andrews


There are two respects in which this book might be said to be historical: first, and most obviously, it deals with the thought of a thirteenth-century philosopher-theologian; second, it was written half a century ago. Like Aquinas, its author was a Dominican friar who lived, taught and wrote within a priory and house of studies located in a medieval university: Aquinas in Paris, Cologne and Naples, Herbert McCabe in Oxford. The editor Brian Davies is another Dominican, a former confrere of McCabe and his literary executor who, since McCabe's death in 2001, has published five previous volumes based on his literary remains.

This further volume is quite different in origin and character. It consists in the main of a lightly edited version of McCabe's 1957 thesis for the STL degree (Sacrae theologiae licentiatus). As such it was written for a readership of fellow Dominican theologians who shared a Catholic faith and a formation in, and broad commitment to, the thought of Thomas Aquinas. Thus described one might wonder what the point of publishing it now could be other than as an act of filial piety or in completion of a collected writings project. To some extent both motivations may apply, but Davies is correct in concluding, evidently after some hesitation (deriving from the fact that it was never intended for a general readership), that this work should be published for the interest of its treatment of the subject of God and evil. That interest resides in two features. First, the presentation of a Thomistic account of natural (and moral) good and evil, and of the resulting problems of predicating evaluative terms of God. Second, the deployment of ideas and methods drawn from strands within Oxford analytical philosophy of the period, in particular philosophical grammar.

Davies does not make much of the second aspect but I would say it is a central feature of McCabe's method and also a source of a stylistic defect which gives a slight impression of showiness and self-satisfaction. These features are less pronounced in the Appendix, which consists of an article entitled 'Categories' first published in the final volume of Dominican Studies, a short-lived journal of the English Dominicans that ran from 1948-54, but which was reprinted in Anthony Kenny's anthology Aquinas: A Collection of Critical Essays (1969). It was an apt choice for the latter given Kenny's own wish to bring Thomistic and analytical approaches together, but it also indicates something of the difficulty of moving between philosophical styles (a difficulty, incidentally, which Kenny either never encountered or easily overcame) -- the counterpart of an analytical philosopher trying to come to terms with the language and methods of late scholasticism, grappling with 'operations ordered to finalities' and 'species received into the cogitative power'.

It is hard to imagine that McCabe's Dominican contemporaries can have made much of his pressing the traditional theory of categories through a filter woven out of ideas drawn mainly from Geach and Strawson's contributions to Mind in the early 1950s, and applied in an intermittently Wittgensteinean manner. The discussion begins as if in challenge to verificationism:

Some people hold that there is only one kind of genuine statement which can properly be said to be true or false . . . and among pseudo statements are usually included ethical and theological doctrines. . . . What I propose to argue is that there are not one but many kinds of statements (p. 141).

I am taking the view which is fairly common amongst contemporary philosophers that the question of whether or not a sentence makes sense is a question about the ordering of its constituent expressions in accordance with their meaning, and has nothing to do with truth and falsity (p. 146).

Here, however, someone might counter in Thomistic style by making a distinction, observing that '"making sense" is predicated in several ways. There is a question whether a string of words is logico-grammatically (or categorically) well-ordered, and there is a separate question of whether it is of a type that is truth apt, or whose content is appropriately related to a truth-apt type. Two pages later McCabe writes,

It seems clear, then, that when we ask whether 'The King of France is wise' makes sense, we are not asking whether the proposition it expresses can be verified; . . . We are asking, among other things, whether the sentence is or is not like 'The King of France is an exact multiple of three' or 'The breadknife was snoring unusually loudly' in which the predicate is not appropriate to the subject (p. 148).

In fact neither of these seems a plausible candidate for what we are likely to be asking (and it takes some stage-setting to imagine the question being posed). As for 'is not appropriate to', well, 'is' and 'is not appropriate to' are predicated in several ways, not all of which concern logical grammar.

The stylistic affectation is more extensive in the main text, perhaps because of a youthful desire to impress (McCabe was 30 when he submitted his thesis). Unfortunately, attention is inadvertently drawn to it by a somewhat rhapsodic and indulgent Preface by Terry Eagleton. He quotes McCabe as saying "In St Thomas' view it is proper to say 'The human being exists' but not proper to say 'The Englishman exists'". The actual point concerns the distinction between ens per se and ens per accidens, but Eagleton takes it as an opportunity to perform, writing "a claim that will no doubt be greeted with acclaim in a good many outposts of the post-colonial world" (p. viii).

If it seems humorless not to enjoy this banter, consider how Eagleton continues to present McCabe's arguments:

It does not make sense to say that the essence of anything as such is evil. It is good in itself that there are lentils and equilateral triangles around the place. This, of course, also commits us to the unpalatable proposition that it is a good thing that Britney Spears exists, or that Michael Jackson did; but however palpably absurd the claim might appear, we simply have to cling to faith here against all seductions of reason (p. viii).

Then on the next page we are told that "As a devout disciple of Aquinas, Herbert McCabe was of course an essentialist -- a doctrine that for post-modernism is only mildly less reprehensible that paedophilia" (p. ix). No one deserves to be introduced by such low wit, and a reader might well be led to think that if this is an example of McCabe's influence, and a reliable indicator of what follows, one may as well not bother.

This inference would be quite wrong. In five chapters totaling less that 130 pages, McCabe formulates the problem of evil ("Quite frequently horrible things happen . . . So, why does God not intervene?"), dismisses certain familiar responses, and develops an account of the nature of being, and of substantial being in particular, in terms of which he explains natural good and evil, and then argues that these terms cannot be predicated of God in the manner necessary to pose (univocally) evil in creation and good in the creator.

The initial responses to the problem briefly stated and dismissed are the following: 1) it may not be possible to prevent one evil without committing another; 2) an inability to do the impossible is not a limitation of even a divine agent; 3) talk of 'evil' is simply an expression of disfavour; 4) the appearance of evil may be an illusory effect of seeing only a part of a whole; and 5) evil is simply the absence of good. In fact McCabe is not opposed to the suggestion that evil is a privation. He writes "Evil is a lack of good. It is a certain kind of absence" and argues that it is an absence of propria, properties pertaining to the nature of a thing, the possession of which is required for its natural fulfillment.

To situate and evaluate the view McCabe is proposing, it is worth drawing back to consider more broadly the challenges to religious faith. There are, I think, three main obstacles to belief, or likely stumbling blocks for those already possessed of it: first, the existence of evil; second, the hiddenness of God; and third, the possibility of naturalistic explanations of the universe and of the particularities of human experience.

These considerations register somewhat differently relative to the experience of individuals and to the general state of intellectual culture. In particular, the issues of hiddenness and of naturalism, though by no means absent from pre-modern thought, were held at bay in part because of the belief that the natural world itself gave evidence of the existence of a divinity behind it, and because of the extensive presence of traditions that spoke confidently of past and ongoing divine revelations.

So while we find St Anselm struggling with the seeming absence of God, "But if you are everywhere, why do I not see you present? . . . Again, by what marks, under what form, shall I seek you? . . . What, O most high Lord, shall this man do, an exile far from you?" (Proslogium I), this is against a background that includes St Paul's intended reminder that "the invisible things of God, from the creation of the world, are clearly seen, being understood by the things that are made, his eternal power also and divinity" (Romans 1). Anselm's trouble is not that his empty experience suggests the non-existence of God; it is rather that because he believes in God he craves an encounter.

Similarly, while pre-modern authors discuss the challenge posed by evil, this is against a background of belief in a created order and the question is engaged either as part of inter-philosophical-theological disputes or in an effort to provide a theodicy explaining how suffering and sin are permitted as part of a salvific economy.

The power of the naturalistic challenge, then, is that it threatens to undermine natural theology, thereby forcing a reinterpretation of divine distance into one of total absence. It might also seem to force a similar retreat in the face of the problem of evil, but that is not so clear, for there is a question whether the critic can simultaneously avow naturalistic explanations of the universe and human experience while also asserting the existence of natural and moral evil.

The problem is not the particular one of accounting for ethical value and requirement but accounting for malum (badness/evil) at all. One might define it as the object of aversion, but first there is surely good and bad apart from seeking and avoiding, indeed, this explains the common judgement that a desire might be perverse because its content or object is bad. One might then qualify the initial proposal by speaking of rational aversion, but that simply focuses attention on the need for an account of what makes something a proper object of aversion, which quickly brings us back to badness, and more pertinently to goodness since the two are evidently linked. This, though, encourages the thought that value and disvalue in nature relate to order, which raises the question of whether an argument to design might not be back on the agenda. Of course, contemporaries have an immediate rejoinder in the idea that order is explicable without reference to purpose. In that case, however, so too is disorder and the failure of purpose, and so one might then do better to drop the idea that the existence of natural evil is an objection to religious belief and press instead the notion that once naturalistic explanation is in place there is no scope for faith in providential governance, adequate or otherwise.

McCabe is not concerned either with the argument from hiddenness or that from naturalism, but his treatment does rest heavily on the idea that good and evil in the world are related to limits or failures or obstacles to natural fulfillment. In brief, existence is always related to natures, either directly, inasmuch as a subject belongs per se to a substantial kind, or indirectly, inasmuch as a feature inheres in or is attached to such a subject. Within the category of non-substantial predications we then need to distinguish between those ascribing properties (or the privation of them) and those relating to possession or lack of accidental features. It is a mark of the former (propria) that properties are characteristics that relevant subjects must have either universally or for the most part, 'ut in pluribus'. There is an acknowledged Aquinian debt here to Aristotle and a later echo in some applications of Wittgenstein's notion of a criterion and, relatedly, of a priori exception-admitting generalizations. McCabe mentions Wittgenstein's idea that rules cannot universally be broken (p. 37), but the criterion parallel is not mentioned and would reward exploration.

Properties are not parts of the essence of a substance but flow from it or express it, such that for a K to have a given K-type property is for it to be more K-like. Equally, the privation of a proper characteristic, whether by nature or through volition, impedes perfection and is the focal point of the idea of evil. Within nature the activities of things criss-cross in ways that lead to impediment, inhibition or diminishment, and on that account it can truly be said that something is bad for an agent or patient. What cannot be said, however (at least not in a problem-causing sense), is that God is the author of such losses (or gains) in consequence of his creative role. For creation is not action immanent within nature but the bringing into being of nature, and what is predicated within cannot thereby be transferred in direct application to its transcendent cause. More generally creation, strictly speaking, cannot be achieved well or badly because it is not a making of one thing from another or an action by an agent upon another. McCabe writes,

It is not because God is kindly and loving that he cannot create a defective thing formally speaking (though of course he can and did create a world containing defective things). It is because defect and lack of defect are expressions that can only have application after creation (p. 105). 

Put another way, the causes and explanations of evil, of defect and displacement, lie entirely within the world and that is so whether we are concerned with evil suffered (malum poenae) or evil done through intentional voluntary action (malum culpae).

McCabe recognizes that the argument to the effect that there could not be a world of interacting substances in which there was not gain and loss with respect to nature-fulfilling properties does not cover the case of moral evil or, as it is seen in theological perspective, sin. That is so since it does not pertain to the fulfillment of any rational nature that it act wrongly; indeed, quite the contrary. So God could have created a natural order in which there was no possibility of malum culpae. To ensure this, however, he would have had to eschew the creation of free rational agents, and, moreover, in permitting such creatures to act freely and wrongly God is not thereby doing evil.

The recent growth of philosophical interest in the problem of evil has developed as part of the revival of philosophy of religion in its natural theology guise. That began a little after McCabe wrote his thesis, though John Mackie had published his first attempt at a logical version of the argument from evil in 1955. It was not until twenty years later, however, that attention shifted to the evidential argument to the effect that the existence of evil, or of particular kinds or scales of evil, renders the existence of God highly improbable. Unsurprisingly, therefore, McCabe does not engage these, but apart from that fact two concerns arise from what he does discuss. First, evil suffered does not simply pertain to the want of characteristics proper to substances (propria), or at any rate it would take a great deal of work to show how this is so. Second, McCabe's opening formulation of the problem of evil included mention of God's failure to intervene when evil occurs, but his solution is to the more limited problem of reconciling the existence of evil with that of God, which leaves the question of alleviation unaddressed.

One might reply that this misses the point that God does not act as an agent in the world and could not do so without causing other evils, but I do not see that this is something that McCabe should want to or can say. In any case one might ask why even if God need not act to impede or rectify evil he might nevertheless come in mind or spirit to those who suffer it. Here the issue of revelation reappears but so too does the question of divine hiddenness. There is an answer suggested by the mystics but it is hard to contemplate: it is that God is not hidden; rather, we are blind and our blindness is culpable. That, at least, is the natural interpretation of the report by Julian of Norwich in the Revelations of Divine Love: "nothing kept me from him except sin, and I saw that this is so with all of us".

Note: Prior to the appendix reprinting the 'Categories' essay there is a short Afterword subtitled 'A Personal Memory'. Since no author's name is given, the natural assumption is that it is by the editor Brian Davies. It is in fact by Timothy Radcliffe, formerly Master General of the Dominican Order and Grand Chancellor of the Pontifical University of St Thomas Aquinas, Rome.