God and Moral Law: On the Theistic Explanation of Morality

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Mark C. Murphy, God and Moral Law: On the Theistic Explanation of Morality, Oxford University Press, 2011, 192pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693665.

Reviewed by Mike Almeida, University of Texas at San Antonio


In God and Moral Law, Mark Murphy aims to show that moral concurrentism is the best theistic explanation of moral law. He takes it that the best theistic explanation of moral law just is the best theistic explanation of morality generally since, on Murphy's account, the explanation of every moral fact "must bottom out in moral laws". (12) There are larger goals in the book that remain less explicit to the actual line of argument. Murphy urges that once we examine a suitable candidate for the theistic explanation of morality, "it may turn out that what ultimately moves us to a theistic account of morality is not so much the distinctive features of morality but the distinctive features of God." (6) So, God and Moral Law aims to show not merely that moral concurrentism is the best theistic explanation of morality, but that theistic explanations of morality offer a better explanation of morality than do their competing secular counterparts.

The introduction to God and Moral Law explores the philosophical methodology adopted for the project and the philosophical theology it requires. The methodology deserves some mention. Murphy distinguishes an "explanandum driven approach" from an "explanans driven approach" to the problem of the relationship between God and morality (3). An explanandum driven approach to the problem takes as data certain features of morality -- the normativity or prescriptivity of morality, say, its universality, impartiality andoverridingness -- and determines which actual objects or events best explain the data. Had Murphy taken the explanandum driven approach to the explanation of morality, he would have provided an argument that the best explanation of morality and its distinctive features is a theistic explanation. But Murphy adopts instead an explanans driven approach according to which we are required to find some existing object G which is such that, relative to the explanation eligible facts E, G not only can explain E, G must explain E. (4). What is interesting about the explanans driven approach is it involves specifying an object that is not merely sufficient to do the explanatory work but "necessarily does that sort of explanatory work, something the essence or nature of which is to do that sort of explaining." (4).

Part of what makes the adoption of the explanans driven approach peculiar is that, according to Murphy,

[an] explanans driven explanation lacks apologetic value. If one argues that, given God's existence, God's character as an essential explainer militates in favor of a certain theistic account of morality, that gives the nontheist no reason to suppose that the best explanation of morality is a theistic explanation. (5)

If an explanans driven approach has no apologetic value in the sense Murphy describes, then it is hard to see how taking such an approach could, as described above, move us ultimately to a theistic account of morality. If consideration of the distinctive features of God in relation to morality does not at least increase the likelihood of the hypothetical explanans, then the explanans driven approach is not particularly well-suited to at least one goal (admittedly, not the most pronounced goal) of the book. But further, if Murphy is right about the lack of apologetic value in the explanans driven approach, then presumably there would be no corresponding decrease in the likelihood of the hypothetical explanans even if the distinctive features of God in relation to morality yielded a moral picture broadly and deeply inconsistent with the moral explananda. But then the explanans driven approach so described would amount to an odd exercise in determining what morality might look like under the assumption of a hypothetical explanans whose nature makes it an essential explainer of morality.

I think it is good news for the project that Murphy is probably mistaken about the apologetic value of the explanans driven approach. There is really no reason not to believe that consideration of the distinctive features of God in relation to morality either increases or decreases the likelihood of the hypothetical explanans. The risk is that the hypothetical explanans is not thoroughly insulated from disconfirmation, but the benefit is that the project has something more than intramural relevance.

The initial focus on philosophical theology is part of the logic of the explanans driven approach that Murphy adopts. We must locate a theistic explanans for moral laws, and morality generally, that enjoys a nature that makes it not merely a sufficient explanation for moral law, but a necessary explanation for moral law. The central premise in Murphy's argument for moral concurrentism over its theistic competitors -- the competitors he considers are standard natural law theory (moral conservationism, if you will) and theological voluntarism (moral occasionalism) – first appears in the introduction with the identification of the particular conception of God required for the project. In chapter 2, section 4, Murphy details the implications of this conception and states desiderata for any adequate theistic explanation.

God has the property of being necessarily the explainer of moral law, according to Murphy, since God has the divine perfection of sovereignty.

The perfection I am appealing to here is usefully called sovereignty . . . Sovereignty involves sourcehood and control: for something to be sovereign over a domain is for things in that domain to be dependent on that being for their existence/actuality and to have their character controlled by facts about that being. . . Note that sovereignty, involving sourcehood and control, does not on this account entail discretion. For a being to be sovereign is to be responsible for other things' existence and character; it need not be possible for these things not to exist or to have a different character. Sovereignty as I am using it is not to be characterized modally; discretion is. (10)[1]

And further on,

Sovereignty as a divine perfection accounts for creator-of-all-else as a divine perfection -- not simply implying it, but including it. For the idea of God as creator is the idea that everything else ultimately depends for its existence and character on God. (11)[2]

Murphy urges that it is apriori necessary that God is sovereign in the sense that he uses the term 'sovereign'. Further on, the sourcehood and control features characterizing the divine perfect of sovereignty discussed in the initial chapters are replaced with (presumably the same thing on Murphy's usage) the features of dependency and control.

Here the concept of dependency does not entail counterfactual dependency. Objects and states of affairs whose existence and character are such that it is impossible that God should alter them do not constitute counterexamples to God's sovereignty. It is sufficient to establish dependency and control that such objects and states of affair depend metaphysically on God: that such objects and states of affairs would not exist/obtain or have any character at all had God, counterpossibly, failed to exist.

The puzzling feature of the relevant concept of sovereignty is that it does not entail or include discretion, but it does include or entail immediacy. The immediacy feature of divine sovereignty is advanced in chapter 2. One consideration in favor of immediacy, according to Murphy, involves God's omnipresence.

One might be driven by explanandum-focused considerations to think that spacetime particularly needs God's active involvement in order to be created and sustained. But on explanans-focused grounds -- the idea that God exhibits full control -- the considerations pushing toward active control over each point of spacetime push toward God's having an immediate explanatory role with respect to all that exists and all that is done. (67)

So, on this view, nothing could be sovereign if it were not itself the immediate explanation of the existence and character of all explananda. But something could be sovereign if it were impotent to modify in the slightest the existence and character of any explanandum.[3] But we might ask why, on explanans-focused grounds, the very same considerations that push toward God's active control over each point of spacetime do not also push toward God's having discretionary control over the existence and character of allexplananda? Conversely, if the concept of sovereignty admits non-discretionary dependence, it's hard to see why it wouldn't also admit of fully mediated explanation. The immediate explanation for the existence and character of necessarily existing objects surely also explains why God has no discretion concerning their existence and character.

But Murphy cannot weaken the position that the relevant concept of sovereignty entails that God is essentially the immediate explanation for all explananda. That God is the immediate explanation of all explananda, including all moral law, constitutes the primary objection to the sort of theistic explanation found in standard natural law theory. So the feature of immediacy is necessary to ruling out one of two theistic competitors in the explanation of moral law. The immediacy argument against standard natural law theory is advanced in chapter 3:

The explanans-centered considerations on which I insisted in 1.2 and 2.4 will not be met simply by appealing to God as lawmaker (3.4) or by appealing to God as ensuring the background in which moral law is normatively effective (3.5). For not only do these replies fail to secure theistic immediacy in the explanation of moral law (2.4), they fail to secure any sort of theistic explanation. (85)

Of the five replies to the immediacy objection that Murphy offers on behalf of standard natural law theory, the fourth seems best. We are to suppose that properties, including moral properties, exist in virtue of some divine activity in the divine mind in which all creative possibilities are represented:

It is clear that in the introduction of divine responsibility for the relevant properties, we are finally in the ballpark of theistic explanation of moral law. The previous answers that we considered gave us no reason to think that either the properties related by moral necessitation or the relationship of moral necessitation itself is theistically explained. (88)

But this view is found wanting too, since God's role on this account in the explanation of moral law is no more than causal. God causes the properties to exist, but it is the nature of the properties alone that explains why, for instance, being a murdering of an innocent person morally necessitates not being performed. God does not immediately figure in the explanation of the lawlike relation in which these properties stand.

The second puzzling feature of the relevant concept of sovereignty is that it does not entail or include completeness, but it does include or entail immediacy. Murphy observes the following.

[Theistic immediacy] is, importantly, not a theory about the theistic completeness of explanation . . . To hold to theistic completeness would be to hold that facts about God are the immediate and sole explanation of whatever is explanation-eligible -- that everything that can be explained depends entirely and without qualification on facts about God. (62)

But we might reasonably expect that the more theistically complete the explanation of all explananda, the greater the expression of divine sovereignty. Murphy does not seem entirely unsympathetic to this view:

I do not think I can show why completeness does not follow from the divine perfection, while immediacy does. My best answer with respect to completeness is that we do in fact hold views on reflection that are incompatible with completeness and we lack any successful argument from the divine perfection to the view that theistic explanation must be complete. (64)

But it's not difficult to see that two beings indiscernible with respect to the immediacy of their explanatory roles display different degrees of sovereignty if they differ significantly with respect to the fullness or completeness of their explanatory roles. If the explanatory role of one is complete, then the explanatory dependency is complete. Nothing but God alone plays any role in explaining any explanation-eligible state of affairs.

But Murphy cannot strengthen the position of the relevant concept of sovereignty to entail that God is essentially the complete explanation for all explananda. That God is not the complete explanation of all explananda, including all moral law, constitutes the primary objection to the sort of theistic explanation found in theological voluntarism. So the incompleteness is necessary to ruling out one of two theistic competitors in the explanation of moral law. The argument against theological voluntarism is advanced in chapter 4.

Theological voluntarism includes the assumption that the moral statuses of actions depend immediately upon the divine will (command, intention, etc.) and there is nothing other than the divine will on which the moral statuses of actions depend. (100) The view that God's commands might be the complete causal explanation of the moral statuses of actions comes in for lots of criticism. The general concern seems to be how it could happen that a non-normative fact -- say, the fact that an action A is commanded -- makes it the case that A is normatively necessary. But it is difficult to appreciate the concern. We frequently observe credible examples of a normative fact supervening on the non-normative fact of commanding. To take the most obvious example, a military officer might issue an order to charge a particular hill. The issuing of the command does yield a (at least prima facie) normative requirement to charge the hill. There seems nothing especially to marvel at here. The officer has the authority to issue such commands, but presumably God is similarly authorized.

But Murphy offers a different, purportedly devastating, objection to theological voluntarism. Let the thesis of wholesale moral contingency be the view that, for every possible maximal set of non-moral, non-divine facts F and for any set of moral facts M, it is possible that F & M and it is possible that F & ~M. According to Murphy, the theologicalvoluntarist who rejects the thesis of wholesale moral contingency is committed to the position that God issues some commands necessarily.

If wholesale moral contingency is to be denied . . . then the voluntarist has a very nasty paradox on his or her hands. For it looks all the world like these natural facts have a normative power with respect to God that they are, on the voluntarist view, not supposed to have with respect to created agents. (123)

But the denial of wholesale moral contingency has no such paradoxical consequence. It is false, for instance, that God must issue the command not to harm innocent children in every world in order to prohibit the harming of innocent children in every world. In one world God might issue the express command that we not harm innocent children, in another world he might issue the command that we live peaceably with one another, in yet another world he might issue the command that we love one another. There are a multitude of non-equivalent commands all of which might yield a prohibition against the harming of innocent children. Moral casuistry is not as simple as determining the logical entailments of your moral principles. There is no world in which harming innocent children is not prohibited, the voluntarist should reply, but that does not entail that, necessarily, God issued some particular command.

The final chapters of the book assess conclusions already reached and advance Murphy's preferred type of theistic explanation of moral law: moral concurrentism. According to moral concurrentism, "all moral necessity is the pull of divine goodness specified by the nature of the creatures involved." (162) God is the source of the goodness that is determinable in a variety of ways depending on the natures of individual kinds. The good for human beings is not the good for orangutans, for instance. Unlike Robert Adams's identification of the property of being good with the property of being Godlike, Murphy relativizes goods (at least those that make a thing good) to kinds. We're informed that it is not a good thing about a rhino that it can play an oboe, since this is not a way in which a rhino can resemble God. Presumably the same holds for chimpanzees or Neanderthal man. But wouldn't it be an extraordinary chimpanzee (or perhaps Neanderthal) that could compose a sonnet? It's difficult to see why that would not be good in a chimpanzee though it is presumably not in the nature of chimpanzees generally to compose sonnets. On the other hand, it is not in the nature of human beings generally to run sub-2:30 miles, but it would surely be a good in the human being that achieved it.

Murphy advances, in place of Adams's identification of the property being good and the property being Godlike, the identification of being good and being like God in ways that belong to the kind to be like God.  "Every good, then, is a divine likeness, but those that make a thing good are those divine likenesses such that members of the kind ought to exhibit them" (160). What morally necessitates action for human beings on the moral concurrentist picture is God's goodness as final cause and human nature as the determination of God's goodness. In Murphy's terms, what necessitates action in the moral order is the cooperation between God as the general final cause and the specific character of our nature. (162)

It speaks to the richness of Murphy's discussion that there isn't space enough to discuss all of the issues raised in his proposal of moral concurrentism. His view does satisfy the criteria of immediacy and incompleteness that Murphy proposes. And insofar as these criteria are important to adjudicating among competing theories of theistic explanation, moral concurrentism has an advantage over standard natural law theory and the various forms of theological voluntarism. The book also contains very interesting discussions of the relation between theories of natural law and moral law, theories of occasionalism, conservationism and concurrentism, the relation of moral necessitation to moral obligation, and a fascinating, all-too-brief discussion of moral miracles.

[1] Compare Alvin Plantinga, Does God have a Nature? (Marquette: Marquette University Press, 1974).

[2] See Brian Leftow, 'Is God an Abstract Object?' Nous 24 (1990) 581-98.

[3] In worlds in which nothing exists except necessarily existing objects, there might be a sovereign that is impotent to modify in the slightest the existence and character of allexplananda. If there are no such worlds, then consider the counter-possible hypothesis.