God and Moral Obligation

Placeholder book cover

C. Stephen Evans, God and Moral Obligation, Oxford University Press, 2013, 199pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696680.

Reviewed by Terence Cuneo, University of Vermont


Call an account of moral obligation "robust" if it says that such obligations not only exist but also have the following four features. First, they are objective in the sense that we can be mistaken about them, forming false beliefs about what is genuinely required of us. Second, these obligations provide overriding reasons to act, rendering further deliberation about whether we should conform to them unnecessary and leaving us open to blame if they apply to us and we fail to conform to them. Third, there are features of these obligations that explain why we should care about conforming to them, providing motives for us to act. And, fourth, these obligations are universal in the sense of applying to persons not simply in virtue of their belonging to some social group but simply as persons. Many philosophers, including rational intuitionists and Kantians, have held that there are robust moral obligations. The central thesis of Evans' book is that anyone who holds that there are such obligations should take the divine command theory (DCT) very seriously.

By a divine command theory, Evans has in mind any view according to which there are divine requirements, these being simply "God's will for humans insofar as that will has been communicated to them" (25). Thus understood, the view is in one sense narrow and in another sense broad. The view is narrow since it is a thesis about not the nature of moral goodness, reasons, virtues, or rights, but only moral obligation. Still, the view is fairly broad because it is not committed to a particular position about what God's communicated will is. As Evans understands it, God's communicated will could be a certain range of speech acts, divine desires, or divine willings, for example.

The best way to understand Evans' book is to think of it as making three main moves. The first is to illustrate how nicely the DCT comports with a robust account of moral obligation. This is not a trivial theoretical virtue, in Evans' view, since many metaethical positions do much less well on this score, either because they deny that moral obligations exist in any sense (e.g., error theory), offer a watered-down account of moral obligations (e.g., moral naturalism), or simply fail to deliver any account of moral obligation (e.g., natural law theory).

The second main move that Evans makes is to highlight the degree to which the DCT can accommodate insights and commitments of other views, including those of natural law theory and virtue-theoretic views. Contrary to what many have supposed, Evans maintains that these views are not genuine rivals to the DCT, since they are best understood to furnish accounts not of moral obligation but of character traits (as in the case of virtue theory) or non-moral goods and the reasons that they generate (as in the case of natural law theory). Were one to combine the DCT with a natural law theory, for example, the result would be a view according to which the natural law component specifies those goods that compose human well-being and the reasons they generate. The divine command component, in contrast, would explain (thanks to God's commands) why these goods generate not simply reasons but obligations to act in certain ways. What is more, Evans argues, since the DCT is a purely ontological thesis about the nature of obligation, the view can be married to any number of moral epistemologies, including moral intuitionism. While the DCT requires that God exists, it does not require that we must also believe that God exists in order to know our moral obligations, as we could hold a mistaken view about what grounds these obligations.

The third move that Evans makes is to illustrate the resilience of the DCT, showcasing its capacity to withstand the most prominent objections leveled against it. For example, as Evans understands the DCT, the view is compatible with God's being both essentially good and God's necessarily willing the performance (or non-performance) of certain act-types. If this is so, then there is no reason to think (as many have) that God's commands could be arbitrary or are incompatible with the existence of necessary moral truths.

How compelling is Evans' case for the DCT? The answer depends on how we understand the aim of his book. Understood in one way, Evans has an ambitious agenda, maintaining that the existence of robust obligations does "indeed require a divine law-giver" (22) and that "viewing moral obligations as divine commands makes more sense of these obligations than any alternative account" (28). When understood in this way, Evans' book is not successful; there are simply too many topics that would need defense for it to mount a respectable case that the existence of robust obligation requires the existence of a divine law-giver or that the view makes more sense of such obligations than any alternative account.

Understood in another way, Evans has much less ambitious goals, maintaining only that moral obligations "can be convincingly explained as God's commands" (88) and that the "DCT is a serious competitor that ought to be part of the conversation" (119). But when understood in this way, it is difficult to know how to make sense of much of Evans' discussion, since theistic philosophers already hold that the DCT is a serious competitor. Other passages make it evident that Evans takes himself to be doing more than preaching to the half-converted.

Understood in a third way, the aim of Evans' book is twofold: it is to establish, first, that the DCT is the best account of moral obligation available to fellow theistic philosophers and, second, that those who believe in robust obligation but do not think that God has anything important to do with them should consider the DCT carefully. They should do so because the existence of robust obligations is "difficult to explain without God" (8). Under this reading, it is worth stressing, a successful case for the DCT would not imply that a non-theist who accepts the existence of robust obligations ought to accept it. For while the DCT nicely explains the existence of robust obligation, it does so by helping itself to a highly controversial and substantive ontological commitment, namely, the existence of the theistic God. And that, non-theists might rightly hold, is too high a price to pay. In my judgment, this last interpretation, which takes Evans' project to be ambitious in some respects but not others, is the best way to understand his book. And while Evans' book may not achieve its aim so described, it does, I believe, take some important steps in that direction.

These are steps, however, that most philosophers will be hesitant to follow. Consider, to begin with, those who are out of sympathy with theistic approaches to ethics, such as moral nonnaturalists. Evans dedicates only three pages to engaging with such philosophers and what he does say, I think, is unlikely to generate the conviction that the DCT is a serious rival to their own view. The central challenge that these philosophers would pose to advocates of the DCT such as Evans, I think, is this: nonnaturalists believe that there are moral facts, some of which are moral reasons. These reasons are, moreover, brute features of normative reality; there is nothing deeper in normative or nonnormative reality, for example, which explains why one has a strong reason not to cause gratuitous suffering. What is more, nonnaturalists will continue, these reasons are robust in some of the same ways that Evans specifies in his book; they are, among other things, objective, have motivating force, and are universal in scope.

Nonnaturalists and advocates of the DCT such as Evans agree, then, that:

(A) Necessarily, there are goods and evils that generate moral reasons apart from God's commands.

They also agree that:

(B) Some of these reasons may be irreducible and robust in important ways.

However, advocates of the DCT accept but nonnaturalists reject the claim that:

(C) None of these goods or evils generates moral obligations apart from God's commands.

What does Evans say in defense of this last claim? A few things, but I take his central argument to be this:

What about truths about moral obligations? Do we have good reasons to think that such propositions are brute? Let us assume . . . that humans have moral obligations, and that some of their obligations extend towards all other humans, including people they do not even know and who cannot benefit or harm them. This fact . . . seems surprising. . . . If it is true, then it seems to be the kind of truth that cries out for an explanation. (152)

Nonnaturalists will offer two replies. First, in this passage, Evans maintains that it would be odd, on a nonnaturalist view, if moral obligations were universal in scope. But nonnaturalists will point out that Evans' view is compatible with there being brute nonnatural moral reasons (that are not obligations) that are universal in scope -- reasons that are not explained by the theistic components of his view. If Evans is willing to concede this, however, then it is very difficult to see what it is about the universal scope of moral obligation that should strike us as so odd. Why would universality of scope be unproblematic when it comes to moral reasons (that are not obligations), but very odd when it comes to moral obligations, something that cries out for explanation? Given his other commitments, Evans cannot say that universality of scope with respect to reasons (that are not obligations) is also odd and requires explanation, since that would render his position incompatible with natural law views.

Second, nonnaturalists will ask why they should accept thesis (C), stated above. For suppose that there are goods and evils that generate universal reasons. These reasons are objective, can be decisive (as when they clearly outweigh all competing reasons), can function as motives, and are universal. Why do we need God to explain why, in some cases, these goods and evils generate not mere reasons but moral obligations? In his book Finite and Infinite Goods, Robert Adams offers a putative (and highly controversial) explanation of this, which is that all obligation is social in nature, grounded in the requirements of social agents. But this is not a view that Evans explicitly embraces. (On 27-28, Evans defends a view that he calls a social theory of obligation. This view is, however, weaker than that embraced by Adams, since it does not imply that obligations consist in the requirements of social agents.) To develop a case against nonnaturalism, I would think, an advocate of the DCT such as Evans would need to establish that nonnaturalists have difficulty explaining certain features of robust obligation and that these difficulties are severe enough that the balance of reasons tilts in favor of the DCT. For example, an advocate of the DCT might maintain that moral obligations not only do but also must provide overriding reasons and that nonnaturalists cannot easily explain this "must." But, aside from the remarks about universality quoted above, Evans does not develop this case. To be clear, I do think that there are points that proponents of the DCT can press against nonnaturalist views; it's simply that these points are not pressed.

Let's now turn to a different sort of worry, one more likely to resonate with advocates of theistic views. In Chapter 4, Evans considers what he calls the "prior obligations objection" (98-101). The objection runs thus: suppose God were to command an agent to act in a specific way. It makes perfect sense to inquire why that agent should obey God's command to act in that way. Not all putative commands, after all, generate obligations on the part of their addressees. When she was two years old, for example, my eldest daughter commanded me to stop talking with my wife. Her command, however, generated no obligation to stop talking with my wife. But if not all commands generate obligations, why should an agent obey God's commands?

The answer would seem to be that, according to a view such as Evans', an agent should obey God's commands because they are authoritative for human beings. Or, to state the matter by employing the language of rights, God has a standing right to our obedience. But it is a plausible principle that, necessarily, for each standing right, there is a correlative standing obligation. If you, as a university president, have the standing right against employees of your university that they conform to any well-formed order that you may issue that falls within the scope your office, then they must have the correlative standing obligation to conform to any such order.

The standing obligation for human beings to obey God's commands, however, could not itself be an obligation generated by God's command. For consider the obligation to obey any command that God may issue (when acting in loving character). Suppose that obligation were generated by God's command. If this latter command were to generate an obligation on our part, however, then God must have the authority or standing right to issue it. But if that is true, then there must be a correlative standing obligation on our part to obey that command. But this latter obligation cannot itself be generated by God's command on pain of generating an infinite regress of divine commands. So, there must be at least one moral obligation -- the standing obligation to obey any command that God may issue -- that is not itself generated by God's commands. From which it follows that the divine command theory is false.

Evans offers four replies to this objection. The first is that these standing obligations to obey God are "not actual obligations but just hypothetical ones" -- obligations to obey God "if God issues commands" (99). This strikes me as an unhelpful reply. I see no reason to hold that conditional obligations are not genuine obligations. The obligation not to murder, for example, is plausibly viewed as being conditional: it tells us that if an action is a murder, then we ought not to do it. But it is a genuine obligation all the same.

The second reply that Evans offers is that the standing obligation to obey God's commands is not moral. This is the reply that Adams offers, but it strikes me as also being inadequate. Suppose I refuse to obey some command that God issues. If God has rightful authority over me, then, presumably, I have failed in two ways. I have failed to conform to the moral obligation that is generated by the command God has issued. But I have also wronged God, evincing considerable disrespect toward God, since God has rightful authority over me, a standing right to my obedience. Since this second failing looks, for all the world, like a moral failing, it would appear that the standing obligation to obey God is a moral obligation. At the very least, we now need an argument that the standing obligation is some sort of pre- or non-moral obligation. But the argument is not offered.

The third reply consists in maintaining that the claim that we should obey any command that God may issue is logically equivalent to the claim that God has moral authority. Thus, Evans writes, "it is hard to see" how the claim that God's commands have moral authority "could be the basis for an objection to" their "moral authority" (100). Evans might be correct to say that the claim that we should obey any command that God may issue is logically equivalent to the claim that God has moral authority. Still, this claim about logical equivalence wouldn't imply anything about that in which moral authority consists. For suppose, as advocates of the prior obligation objection maintain, that this authority consists in God's having a standing right to our obedience (maybe because God "owns" us, as Locke thought). This standing right would imply that we have a standing obligation to obey any command that God may issue. If it does, however, then the original charge resurfaces: this standing right would imply a correlative standing obligation that is not itself identical with or grounded in a divine command.

The final reply Evans offers is that, even if the prior obligation objection hits its mark, "someone . . . could still hold that the vast majority of our moral obligations are generated from or identical with divine commands" (101). I find this response puzzling. As I understand it, the DCT is supposed to be a thesis about the nature of moral obligation. To concede that some obligations are not (or not grounded in) divine commands would be to surrender the view.

Evans has written a highly lucid and readable book. But, as my discussion will have made clear, I found myself wanting much more argument at crucial junctures. My sense, then, is that there is some unfinished business that advocates of the DCT must address. The debt we owe to Evans' book is that it pinpoints exactly what this unfinished business is.[1]

[1] My thanks to Tyler Doggett, Steve Evans, and Bill Mann for their feedback on an earlier version of this review.