God and Other Spirits: Intimations of Transcendence in Christian Experience

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Wiebe, Phillip H., God and Other Spirits: Intimations of Transcendence in Christian Experience, Oxford University Press, 2004, 288pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195140125.

Reviewed by Stephen Griffith, Lycoming College


Contemporary Anglo-American philosophers have written many books about God, as one can readily confirm by browsing through any secular academic or upscale public bookstore. They have written few, if any, books about "spirits", or "spirits other than God", as Wiebe would have it. To find books about spirits, one would need to look in another section of the bookstore, possibly in the religion section, but more likely in sections labeled "Parapsychology" or "The Occult". Thus, when I was asked to review a philosophical book entitled God and Other Spirits, I was both surprised and intrigued. What could a professional philosopher possibly have to say about spirits that had apparently escaped the attention of the contemporary philosophical community?

It must first be acknowledged that there are reasons for the apparent neglect of this topic by contemporary philosophers, some of which are worth mentioning at the outset. Philosophers tend to be interested primarily in topics which arise either within the conceptual framework of modern science or within the common sense conceptual framework of the proverbial man in the street. Science, however, is based on intersubjectively verifiable empirical observation, and our common sense framework is based primarily on the commonality of ordinary experience. Encounters with spirits or demons, on the other hand, assuming that they actually occur, are quite extraordinary, in several senses. In the first place, no self-respecting spirit or demon is likely to cooperate with scientific investigators who are attempting to observe or manipulate its behavior, and scientists are not likely to study anything or incorporate anything into their worldview without some such cooperation. In the second place, encounters with spirits or demons, despite the fact that there have been literally thousands of reports of such encounters over the centuries, are nonetheless relatively rare, too rare to constitute a significant portion of our common experience. Apart from these difficulties associated with the extraordinary nature of alleged encounters with spirits and demons, there is the additional fact that, even if some such encounters do in fact occur, there are undeniably many such reports that are at best dubious if not demonstrably false, for all sorts of reasons.

Wiebe is clearly aware of these difficulties, and attempts to deal with them, with mixed success. His situation, in my opinion, is comparable to that of those who wish to take the possibility of miracles seriously. Miracles, like encounters with spirits or demons, are extraordinary, assuming that they occur, and in much the same ways. God is not likely to be cooperative with scientific investigators who attempt to study His miraculous interventions in the created order, if this is what they are, nor is He likely to perform them often enough for them to become an uncontested part of our common experience. Most professional philosophers are at least somewhat familiar with Hume's famous discussion of miracles, which he defines as "violations of the laws of nature", but it is seldom noticed that this argument is essentially based on just these sorts of considerations. Hume argues that whenever we read or hear an account of a supposed miracle, we must always weigh the likelihood that the testimony which we have read or heard is reliable, and not based on hallucinations, exaggerations or outright dishonesty, against whatever evidence we have supporting our beliefs concerning whatever law of nature has supposedly been broken by the alleged miraculous occurrence. Hume then argues that the latter is almost surely bound to outweigh the former, so that belief in miracles is never justified. Many philosophers have weighed in either for or against Hume's position here, but it is in any case clear that many philosophers have not been dissuaded by Hume's argument from taking the possibility of miracles seriously. This might very well be because his argument applies only to those who must base their belief in miracles on testimony. It does not apply directly to those who believe that they themselves have witnessed a miracle. The latter might question their own sanity, and wonder if they might be hallucinating, but if they can satisfy themselves that neither of these hypotheses are true, they must then simply weigh the "testimony" of their own senses against their belief in the relevant law(s) of nature, which is based on inductive inference from sensory experiences that are then to be regarded as no more reliable than the experience in question.

Similar considerations apply to reports of encounters with demons or other spirits. Our epistemological status with respect to reports of such encounters by others differs significantly from that of those who believe they have actually experienced such an encounter. Professor Wiebe admits that he himself has not, nor have I, nor has anyone I know, to the best of my knowledge. Thus, anyone who, like Wiebe, professes to take talk about spirits seriously has several hurdles to overcome. In particular, he must explain why he regards testimony concerning such encounters as reliable, and he must show how such talk can be integrated into a more comprehensive worldview which takes our more generally held beliefs into account. Wiebe does not shy away from either of these challenges.

On those few occasions in the past when I perused works written by non-philosophers about spirits, I found them to be of two sorts: those that took such reports seriously and almost always consisted entirely of anecdotal reports concerning alleged encounters simply taken at face value, with little sophisticated attempt to explain them, and those that simply debunked such reports with an overly broad skeptical brush. Wiebe himself begins by describing several such reports in detail, but the similarity ends there. Although he makes it clear at the outset that he thinks at least some such reports ought to be taken seriously, he also quickly displays an acute awareness of the pitfalls which await anyone who wishes to do so. As he says,

simply relegating alleged events to "primitive minds" or writing them off as instances of "magical thinking", without attempting to explore their character in more depth, strikes me as irresponsible. At the same time, uncritical acceptance of the existence of spirits, without doing the hard work of scrutinizing the claims advanced to support the hypothesis, also seems irresponsible (18).

It is difficult to see how any philosopher could disagree with these sentiments, even if he or she does not accept Wiebe's arguments or conclusions.

One might suppose that a philosophical book entitled God and Other Spirits and subtitled "Intimations of Transcendence in Christian Experience" would be primarily a book in the philosophy of religion. Such a supposition would be false in this case. It turns out that Wiebe engages in lengthy excursions into metaphysics, epistemology, the philosophy of science, and even logic in the course of his deliberations, and incorporates the insights of such philosophical luminaries as Wilfrid Sellars, Richard Rorty, Jaegwon Kim, J.J.C. Smart, Willard van Orman Quine, Alvin Plantinga, and many others. Although he obviously does not (and could not consistently) agree with everything said by each of these philosophers, he does display, for the most part, a fairly good understanding of their basic points of view, and uses this understanding quite competently in expressing his own views. His main thesis is that, once we have eliminated the admittedly many bogus claims concerning encounters with spirits and demons, those that remain deserve to be taken seriously. In particular, he believes that belief in the existence of spirits can best be justified as an abductive inference proffered to explain these experiences, and compares this inference to the one Wilfrid Sellars uses to justify our belief in mental states. Although he does not say so explicitly, it would seem that he might think that we might be justified in postulating the existence of spirits to explain these experiences in much the same way we are justified in postulating the existence of electrons, which we cannot literally sense, to explain various physical and chemical phenomena. In other words, to oversimplify somewhat dramatically, we are justified in believing in the existence of spirits for the same reason we are justified in believing in the existence of such theoretical entities as electrons. Believing in these things enables us to understand and explain experiences which would otherwise be unexplained.

Although I have not been able to do justice to the sophistication of Wiebe's arguments in this review, he makes several additional points which deserve serious consideration. Although he argues against materialism and physicalism, he does not embrace dualism or even supernaturalism. As he says,

nothing requires us to construe the causes of the phenomena outlined and discussed in the first two chapters [concerning encounters with spirits] as existing beyond the natural order. I have been careful to describe the beings postulated to exist in my reconstruction of Christian thought as existing beyond the known natural order [author's italics], but I have attempted to avoid asserting that they are supernatural (150).

And again,

we do not need to follow Smart in defining God and other spirits as nonmaterial and incorporeal and so heighten the prospect of having to endorse dualism. Instead, we can characterize these transcendent beings by the causal roles they are assigned in explanations and tentatively advance a plurality of entities and beings whose precise characteristics we will probably never know completely.

He thus draws a distinction between materialism or physicalism, understood in a fairly traditional way, and a more open-ended naturalism, which would allow for the existence of transcendent beings of unknown nature within the natural world.

As with any book, there are weaknesses in Wiebe's presentation. One minor flaw occurs when he discusses the views of Alvin Plantinga and persists in referring, somewhat oddly, to God, as opposed to belief in God, as "properly basic". Another minor weakness occurs in his discussion of Sellars, when he correctly points out that Sellars regarded the "manifest image of man-in-the-world" (i.e. our common-sense conceptual framework) as incommensurable with the scientific image. He fails to note, however, that Sellars thought we could merge these two images stereoscopically to gain a more complete understanding of reality, a conceptual device which Wiebe might have been able to use to his advantage. Finally, I think Wiebe's argument would have been strengthened significantly if he had paid more attention to how we might distinguish between true encounters with spirits and alleged encounters which are simply hallucinatory or in some other way unreal, or, for that matter, from reports of alien abductions and crop circles. Although he hints at criteria that we might employ for this purpose, and acknowledges the possibility of alternative explanations for some alleged encounters, a fuller treatment of this issue would have been quite useful.

Those who believe in spirits will be pleased with this book. Those who are convinced of their non-existence will not be persuaded by this book. Most importantly, however, those who are open-minded about the possibility that there are such encounters will be given much to think about, and that alone makes it a worthwhile book, in my opinion.