God and the Multiverse: Scientific, Philosophical, and Theological Perspectives

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Klaas J. Kraay (ed.), God and the Multiverse: Scientific, Philosophical, and Theological Perspectives, Routledge, 2015, 247pp., $116.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138788671.

Reviewed by Scott A. Shalkowski, University of Leeds


This volume brings together twelve essays on God and multiverse physical theories. Some theists have embraced a way of understanding modern physics that arose partly as a way of avoiding the apparent theological implications of cosmic fine tuning. Multiverse theories bring with them new options for handling some well-known apologetic problems, such as the problem of evil, though not all contributors embrace the multiverse. The collection has five parts: "Physicists on God and the Multiverse", "Theistic Multiverses: Details and Applications", "Criticisms of Theistic Multiverses", "Pantheistic Multiverses", and "Multiverses and the Incarnation".

Robert B. Mann begins with an essay skeptical of the merits of multiverse theories. Mann's discussion is formulated in terms of a principle of "mediocrity" that began as a claim that there is nothing special about Earth and its location and role in the universe and is now extended to our universe as a whole. He resists this extension by relying on apparent points of "particularity" that make our biophilic universe not merely one amongst infinitely many. Without this extension, he argues that multiverse theories are unwarranted. Regarding the science behind these theories, Mann raises an important question: "How does one go beyond normal scientific inquiry and still do science?" (p. 35). How is it scientifically proper, for instance, for scientific multiverse theories to rely on an arbitrarily large supply of resources for the postulated universe generation or to be beyond the reach of anything like typical empirical refutation? Those touting the scientific credentials of multiverse theories need to address these matters with some urgency.

Like many other works in contemporary metaphysics, many contributors argue their respective cases by noting their preferred theory's alleged virtues compared to some alleged vices of alternatives. Donald M. Page proposes a simplicity-based argument for a theistic multiverse (TM). He admits that our universe is not the best, but that it could be part of the best multiverse, thus undermining some versions of the problem of evil. Page's contribution is one amongst many that rely on some key principle that calls for more justification than it is usually given. It might be that typical standards of simplicity are indicators of truth and that God's contemplating true simple laws of nature brings such value that Page's 'Optimal' Argument for the Existence of God is correct in its premises and conclusion. It is hard, though, to see why the key claims should be plausible. Why is simplicity an indicator of truth rather than of convenience and why think God loves simplicity so much? Whether answers are required demands closer attention to the specific rhetorical and dialectical context within which they are deployed. In defensive maneuvers they have better chances than if Page intends to convert others to TM. Since he notes "it is subjective which theories are simpler" (p. 46), Page has not yet shown that even if his claim about divine contemplation is correct,  this provides grounds for thinking our world/multiverse really is the sort of thing to be so contemplated and, thus, the product of divine creation.

The next three essays defend theistic versions of multiverse theories. Peter Forrest's is quite demanding, both scientifically and philosophically. Those who know about the "Humphrey" objection to David Lewis's metaphysics of many concrete possible worlds will be able to follow the relevant brief section where it figures. Those not already clued up will need to do some homework. Similarly, for "collapse" and "no collapse" versions of quantum theory. The bulk of the essay involves formulations of various forms of multiverse theories (Separate Worlds, Branching, and Hyperspace). The argument for the preferred Hyperspace version involves claims about action, freedom, and persistence as well as theological concerns regarding creation, divine action, suffering, and the afterlife. This is a very dense essay that is most useful for multiverse specialists who must confront nuances of various versions of that genus once it is embraced. It is laudable that Forrest addresses the relation between the physics-inspired multiverse theory and the metaphysics of modal realism. Most readers would find it helpful to have just a bit more that addresses the degree to which multiverse theory constrains the scope of the possible by the basic quantum theory or to what degree the quantum theory that applies to our world is itself a result of a maximally unconstrained "universe generator".

Jason L. Megill defends not a multiverse as physicists understand multiverses, but a plurality of concrete possible worlds -- a pluriverse. He defends a modest version of so-called modal realism, which does not commit him to the existence of every (logically -- though questions against essentialist versions should not be begged) possible world. His argument is based on two claims (94-5):

(1) If an entitiy e is possibly literally concrete in the actual world, then, there is a possible world w in which it is literally concrete.

(2) There (i) is an entity e that is possibly literally concrete in the actual world, but (ii) e is not literally concrete in the actual world.

Megill is right that (1) begs no realist/ersatzist question. All major versions of possible worlds theories, however, agree that both (1) and (2) illicitly mix existence in/at a world with possible existence. Any possible worlds theory that takes existence to explain modality takes the inventory of each world to be defined by what exists at each world. Things not in that world but in some other (accessible) world possibly exist. As 'possibly' and 'actual world' are handled as technical terms in these theories, though, the only things that possibly exist in any given world are those things that do exist in that world. Nothing that fails to exist in the actual world even so much as possibly exists in the actual world, even though they possibly exist and they do exist in their other respective worlds. Megill's argument for a modest modal realism falls at the first hurdle.

Donald A. Turner's essay illustrates the delicacy with which these matters must be handled. Like much of contemporary metaphysics, there are many issues in this domain that take on lives of their own as artifacts of a given framework. Once you embrace a plurality of worlds created by God, the number of them becomes an issue. If creating more than one is desirable for maximizing utility, then why not duplicate some of them? If some, why not all? If some duplication of each, why not lots? If lots, how much? It is very hard to know what is not negotiable in these discussions. The Identity of Indiscernibles? Personal Identity that is a species of Identity? I do not say that Turner's replies to critics are not on point, only that it is very hard to see how to settle the disputes he has with his critics. What to one is wheels coming off of the bus is to another the reconfiguration of a much more satisfactory bus. If, however, we think that we are engaged in truth-telling metaphysics, we must have some grasp of which principles act as a check on the limits of acceptable theory, since empirical data are not up to the task. If elegance, simplicity, beauty, and "explanatory" power are to serve that purpose, it is incumbent upon their users to make the case that these are truth-indicating features and to do so in a way that does not tacitly rely upon a great deal of well-confirmed theory -- as their use in empirical matters does -- even if that is hardly ever noticed by those who invoke them.

Michael Schrynemakers takes aim at Klaas J. Kraay's own development of the theory of TM by relying on a principle that is plausible in a pre-multiverse framework, but dubious within that framework, not unlike Megill. Schrynemakers maintains on pages 134-136 that no possible world contains a world's history along with an alternative history. Yes, so long as we think of possible worlds as single universes, this is so. Once we think that some possible worlds contain multiple universes (whether they branch from each other or are wholly self-contained), then the principle no longer has force. Of course, no universe contains its history plus another. No one maintains that. Whether another universe counts as an alternative possibility for another can be a matter of similarity. For example, I could have done that instead of this, because of what happens in another sufficiently similar universe even if it is part this world. Think of universes that branch at "choice points". Another universe embodies what it was possible for me to do by actually containing me doing it, even though in this universe I did not do it. Furthermore, when multiverse possible worlds are at issue, Schrynemakers is no longer entitled to assume that alternative histories are a matter of different possible divine choices about governing universes. True, multiverse theories can no longer analyze possibility in terms of spatio-temporal unities and they must ultimately supply another account, but Schrynemakers' principle is no less question-begging when scrutinizing them. The multiple histories in a multiverse are all matters of how God does choose to govern.

Michael Almeida scrutinizes claims that TM can help with the problem of evil. On the one hand, it would be convenient if our world were the best possible world. On the other, it is convenient to maintain that divine power and benevolence conspire so that God cannot create any sufficiently morally dubious worlds. If God's power, however, is tied very closely to what it is possible to do, then God's inability to create such dubious worlds renders them impossible. Rather than God choosing from among a wide array of worlds and virtuously choosing to actualize (insofar as God can) a morally laudable world, God's inability to act other than virtuously constrains the very range from which any creative choice could have been made. Even if there is not total modal collapse which thus erases distinctions between necessity, actuality, and possibility (which would be A Very Bad Thing), the range of the possible becomes oddly limited within some developments of TM.

Jeremy Gwiazda's contribution is largely mathematical, focusing on the nature of the infinite and arguing that Cantorian approaches to the infinite are misguided. Infinite numbers -- as contrasted with a never-ending infinite series of numbers -- share characteristics with more tractable finite numbers. Consequently, some paradoxes of the infinite are avoided and there are grounds for thinking that some numbers of universes are antecedently more probable than others, thus neutralizing some grounds for preferring some instances of multiverse theories. This is a highly speculative essay that hangs on the rejection of Cantorian orthodoxy and which demands a fuller treatment than is possible here.

Yujin Nagasawa argues that multiverse pantheism avoids the standard objections to single-universe pantheism. If the multiverse is all of the possible universes, then God is as all-encompassing as anything could be, is the greatest possible being that is necessary, self-existent, transcending any particular cosmos, and exhibiting all possible moral virtue. God is not a creative agent, but is the cause or grounding explanation for any particular cosmos. If greatness is understood as all-encompassing, then God encompasses as much evil as is possible, which appears to be devastating to any form of multiverse pantheism that is not very revisionary regarding God's nature.

John Leslie defends the pantheistic multiverse in what is largely a manifesto. He thinks that reality is most fundamentally infinitely many minds contemplating infinitely many things. Ordinary worldly actors, such as you and I, live in such a mind. Accordingly, it is literally God within whom we live and move and have our being. No metaphor is needed to affirm Acts 17:28. To the extent that Leslie makes a case for his version of multiverse pantheism, he relies on a version of the Identity of Indiscernibles that merits at least some scrutiny beyond the usual, since his version is "if two things were infinitesimally different, then neither of them could change in a way removing the infinitesimal difference without one of them vanishing or else the two of them fusing into one" (p. 198). Perhaps this is just a trivial consequence of the usual atemporal versions of the principle which are not framed in terms of change, but that is not obvious. Regardless, that any differences would be infinitesimal is beside any point regarding the principle itself. Since this is largely a manifesto, there are many points at which the reader will want more explanation and/or more justification for Leslie's unconventional views. The bibliography is dominated by references to his previous relevant work.

Robin Collins maintains that if there are other "vulnerable, embodied conscious agents", whether within our space-time or not, there is no good theological reason to think that God became incarnate only once in the person of our historical Jesus. Philosophically, the Kenotic view -- that God the Son emptied himself of divine attributes -- is difficult to square with multiple incarnations. Some theological and philosophical problems and potential solutions to a practical problem are noted.

Defending a similar thesis, Timothy O'Connor and Philip Woodward round off this collection with some thoughts on the implications of a multiverse for the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation. They rely heavily on the Leibnizian thought that God acts for reasons and not arbitrarily. If there are other "divine image bearing creatures" in need of redemption, then eschewing arbitrariness points toward multiple incarnations of God the Son. Other authors in this collection are attracted to the same Leibnizian thought, which is somewhat under-explored and under-justified. It is one thing to act without sufficient reason when such reasons are to be had, but another to act without sufficient reason when none is to be had. Some have inferred a multiverse from some principle of non-arbitrary divine action; O'Connor and Woodward are prompted to explore multiple incarnations. Though the exploration is worthwhile, so would be a more intense and direct exploration of the prompting principle. Why, for instance, does the non-arbitrariness principle warrant the expansion of universes created or the number of incarnations? Why couldn't the lack of good reasons to choose one thing over another show the limitation of the principle? One worry to be dispelled is that philosophical and theological problems are granted more plausibility than they ought to have, were the principle examined more directly.

This is a valuable collection of state-of-the-art essays on a timely topic. Each essay has material worth considering and each bibliography is a useful resource. I look forward to those working on the topics addressing some of the issues that newcomers may find to be barriers to entry to the philosophical and theological reflections contained in the book.