God and the Reach of Reason: C.S. Lewis, David Hume, and Bertrand Russell

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Erik J. Wielenberg, God and the Reach of Reason: C.S. Lewis, David Hume, and Bertrand Russell, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 243pp., $21.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521707107.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


In this book Erik Wielenberg offers C.S. Lewis's views on religion and brings in Hume's and Bertrand Russell's ideas in order to set up a problem, to which he gives what he thinks would be Lewis's responses, followed by his own assessment of those responses. For instance, he presents Hume's views on the problem of evil and his view that "it is never reasonable to believe that a miracle has occurred on the basis of religious testimony alone" (p. 146). Wielenberg then considers how Lewis would respond and eventually argues that he has no adequate answer to the most difficult version of the problem of evil. In the case of Russell, Wielenberg presents Russell's view that God can be good only if he conforms his actions to a moral law of which he is not the author (p. 65) and then critically discusses whether Lewis has an adequate response. He concludes that Lewis does not.

Wielenberg starts his book with the problem of evil with a formulation he takes from Philo's remarks in Hume's Dialogues on Natural Religion. A crucial premise in the version of the problem that Wielenberg reconstructs from Philo's remarks says: if God is morally perfect, he wants there to be no suffering in the world. Of course, from this it does not follow that there is no suffering in the world, even if we assume that God is all-knowing, all-powerful, and morally perfect, because God may have a reason for allowing some suffering, perhaps because he must if he is to allow people freedom of the will and action or perhaps he must if he is to "nudge" them to enter freely into a loving relation with Him. A good parent would not want her child to suffer even though she would allow suffering, say, from the effects of chemotherapy if that is the only chance of curing the child's leukemia.

Why, according to Lewis, would God allow his creatures to suffer even though he wants there to be no suffering? Wielenberg lists Lewis's three reasons for pain, by which he means suffering. First, pain can cause us to "recognize our moral shortcomings" (p. 29). Wielenberg quotes Lewis who writes, "God whispers to us in our pleasures, speaks in our conscience, but shouts in our pain: it is His megaphone to rouse a deaf world" (p. 30). When we do wrong and are caught we suffer the consequences and become aware of our moral shortcomings. Second, Lewis thinks that God allows us to suffer in order to become aware that we are looking for happiness in the wrong places, in earthly things rather than in a relationship with God (cf., p. 30). For some, it is only when the stock market crashes or the banks foreclose on their homes that they come to realize that there are more important things in life. Finally, for Lewis, the best sort of life is one where we freely choose to be in relationship with God. According to Wielenberg, Lewis thinks we freely choose such a relationship only if we choose it for its own sake and know that we do. For Lewis, in order to know that we choose a relationship with God for its own sake, we must choose the relationship in pain, as Abraham does when he chooses to sacrifice Isaac because he believes God commands it (cf., pp. 32-33). If we do not choose the relationship in pain, how can we know that we do not choose it for the pleasure it brings or the pain it relieves?

These reasons can explain why God would allow some suffering, but as Wielenberg points out, "If Lewis's answer to the problem of pain is to be entirely successful, all human natural suffering must be explicable in terms of the three roles described in this section" (p. 35). Natural suffering is suffering that does not result from the free actions of anyone, suffering of the sort that Wielenberg notes at the beginning of his first chapter when he discusses the Lisbon earthquake of 1755 and the more recent tsunami in Indonesia in 2004 (pp. 7-8). Lewis's reasons why God allows suffering boil down to the fact that allowing it is needed to "nudge" people "toward genuine happiness" (p. 40; cf., 45), to freely choose what is really, and not just apparently, good for them, namely, a relationship to an all-knowing, all-powerful, morally perfect, loving God.

Wielenberg presents Lewis's defense against the charge that pain (read "suffering") is not fairly distributed; some bad people experience little and some good people a lot. Bad people do not experience enough pain and good people too much. Lewis thinks that we are in no position to judge this since we do not really know what our, or others', moral character is like (pp. 44-45). In addition, God would not allow pain to be inflicted on really bad people, on "incorrigibles" who cannot be nudged to seek what is truly good for them, since that would be to allow pointless suffering. So some of the people we think are bad but suffer little may be incorrigibles and others may not really be bad. On the other hand, some of the people we think are good but suffer greatly may not really be good. In short, for Lewis we are in no position to judge that suffering is unfairly distributed among good and bad people.

Wielenberg finds it hard to believe that of the hundreds of thousands of people who suffered in the 2004 tsunami in Indonesia, "each person who suffered received precisely the right amount of pain required for the promotion of genuine happiness" (p. 48). However, even if each person did suffer just the right amount, he thinks that Lewis has no solution to the problem posed by the suffering of children. Surely we know that children are innocent and so not bad people, and that in some cases the suffering they experience is horrendous. Could God allow this suffering as a way of nudging other people toward freely choosing a better life for themselves? Wielenberg thinks that it would be unjust to let innocent children suffer for the good of others (p. 51). The same sort of Kantian objection is applied to the Nazi experiments on Jews and the Tuskegee study of syphilis in African-American men.

Wielenberg does not consider the reply that normally it is not morally permissible to allow some to suffer for the benefit of others but here it is permissible because God compensates the children who suffer by bringing them eternal happiness through union with Him in the afterlife. But could a good parent, say, allow his teenage son to hit his little brother with a hammer, then punish him to "nudge" him toward better character, and next compensate the little brother by taking him on a very fun vacation to Disneyland? Wouldn't the good parent instead just stop his son from hitting his little brother and take the little brother on the fun vacation anyway? If so, why wouldn't God prevent innocent children from suffering terribly and instead bring them directly to heaven rather than allowing them to suffer at the hands of monsters or in the wake of natural disasters?

Wielenberg thinks that Lewis does not adequately reply to the problem of evil when properly understood as the problem of God's allowing horrendous natural suffering to befall children who will not be led to embrace genuine happiness as a result. However, whether we should then disbelieve in the God of Christianity is still an open question, for there might be reasons for believing in him that are weightier than the reasons the problem of evil offers for disbelief. This is what leads Wielenberg to consider next "the positive arguments Lewis offers in favor of Christianity" (p. 55).

Lewis offers three arguments for the existence of some sort of Higher Power: from "human morality, our capacity to reason, and a kind of desire he labels 'Joy'" (p. 59). Lewis thinks it is obvious that there are some objective moral truths which we know to be true, truths such as "it is morally wrong to torture innocent children purely for entertainment" (Wielenberg's example, p. 60), and moral claims that are true "regardless of what anyone may think of them" (p. 60). In addition to objective moral obligations and our knowledge of them, Lewis notes that we have a sense of obligation that urges us to do right, and a sense of guilt that manifests itself when we do wrong. According to Wielenberg's reconstruction, Lewis's argument is an inference to the best explanation of these three moral phenomena (moral obligation, moral knowledge, and moral emotions (p. 77; see also, p. 62)) with the conclusion being that "a good, mindful Higher Power that created the universe" is "the ultimate source of rightness and wrongness" (p. 65), our capacity to know objective moral truths a priori, and our sense of obligation and guilt (p. 63).

One problem with Lewis's argument is that it does not consider the totality of evidence. People not only have a sense of obligation and guilt, they also are tempted to do wrong and some seem to aim at evil for its own sake (cf., p. 75 and 72-73). In addition, some people are psychopaths and lack a sense of obligation and feelings of guilt (pp. 80-82). Perhaps the best explanation of the total phenomena is some sort of Dualism, that is, the existence of both a good and an evil Higher Power. Further, Wielenberg argues that evolutionary psychology promises an explanation of our sense of obligation and guilt (pp. 84-87), and our ability to know objective moral truths (pp. 89-92). Our ancestors who had the relevant cognitive and emotional capacities were desirable in cooperative ventures and reaped the attendant benefits. If moral truths are not only objective but necessary, no explanation of their existence is required (cf., we don't need God to explain why 2 + 2 = 4; p. 88 for Wielenberg's discussion).

Lewis has another argument for the existence of a Higher Power that depends on our ability to gain knowledge through reasoning, say, knowledge that I am mortal by reasoning: all humans are mortal; I am a human; therefore, I am mortal (Wielenberg uses this example, p. 95). For me to have knowledge of the conclusion, the premises must not only entail it, but I must also see that they do. Suppose that that sort of "seeing" implies knowing that the premises entail the conclusion. According to Wielenberg, for Lewis, "S knows p only if (i) S believes p and (ii) the complete cause of S's belief that p is the truth of p itself" (p. 98). But how can the fact that the premises of some argument entail its conclusion cause, in a way acceptable to Naturalism, my belief that they do? It can't because a logical relation cannot be the efficient cause of anything. However, if reasons can be causes, and human beings are rational, and not simply natural, beings then it is possible for an entailment to cause (by being a reason for) a belief to exist, and thus knowledge by reasoning would be possible. We know that knowledge by reasoning is possible, that Naturalism cannot explain that possibility, and that it can be explained by assuming that a Higher Power created rational human beings whose nature is not reducible to what it is on Naturalism. Hence, the best explanation of knowledge through reasoning involves the existence of a Higher Power. Thus we are justified in believing in such a Power.

This is not the argument Wielenberg attributes to Lewis. He thinks that Lewis holds that "seeing" that the premises of some argument entail its conclusion is an intentional mental state (one that has as its object a proposition) and that Lewis believes that Naturalism must hold that such intentional mental states cannot evolve from more primitive non-intentional mental states. Wielenberg has no trouble in raising doubts about such a claim. However, perhaps Lewis intended the argument I gave above, and then Wielenberg's objection is irrelevant. To that argument I would respond that it assumes a flawed conception of knowledge. On the basis of induction, I know that I will be dead on January 1, 2100, but the truth of that belief is not the complete cause of my belief that I will then be dead. Future states have no more causal powers in the present than do logical entailments, but that does not prevent me from knowing propositions about the future.

The third argument that Lewis offers for the existence of a Higher Power starts with a desire that Lewis calls Joy and understands as "a desire for union with God" (p. 113; cf., p. 109). No doubt this will strike you as an odd definition of "Joy," which is an emotion and not a desire at all. But set that aside and just assume that Joy is what Lewis says it is. His argument then is: all natural desires can be satisfied, that is, there exist means for satisfying them; Joy is a natural desire; therefore, the means for satisfying it exist; so God exists. The argument for the first premise seems to be inductive: hunger is a natural desire and food exists; the desire for sex is a natural desire and sex exists; the desire for sleep is a natural desire and sleep exists. So, probably the means to satisfy all natural desires exist.

Wielenberg rightly criticizes this inductive argument on the grounds that the object of Joy is a supernatural being while the objects of the other desires are natural. If we cannot know by induction that a swan is white, if that swan is in many ways unlike most swans, how, Wielenberg wonders, can we know via induction that Joy, which is quite unlike other natural desires, is like those desires in that its object exists (p. 114)? At most one should conclude that the objects of natural desires exist insofar as they are natural objects. No one should conclude that a convicted murderer (who is a criminal) will probably get less than ten years because all known convicted burglars (who are also criminals) have gotten less than ten years. Despite similarities, relevant differences make a difference.

An inference to the best explanation that invokes a Higher Power to explain the existence of what Lewis calls Joy fares no better than the inductive argument. Again, evolutionary psychology does as well (pp. 115-19). Wielenberg says that "one of the main effects of Joy is that it prevents a person from deriving lasting contentment from earthly things" (p. 116). He argues that being in this constant state of discontent can motivate us to put an end to it, and the side effects might be beneficial from a reproductive standpoint. As Wielenberg writes, "Dissatisfaction can benefit us in the long run" (p. 116). Hence, Joy, understood as Lewis does, might be given an evolutionary explanation even if its object, God, does not exist. The evolutionary explanation is as good, if not better, than the God hypothesis.

Lewis thinks that the arguments from morality, reason, and joy make it reasonable to believe that some sort of Higher Power exists. He thinks that given that it is reasonable to believe that some Higher Power exists, the historical events surrounding Jesus' life make it reasonable to believe in the Resurrection and thereby that the Higher Power is the God of Christianity. Because the Resurrection would be a miracle if it occurred, Lewis considers Hume's argument that, according to Wielenberg, concludes that, "it is never reasonable to believe that a miracle has occurred on the basis of religious testimony alone" (p. 146; cf., pp. 126-27, 130), where religious testimony is understood to be "testimony by human beings that is intended to support a particular 'system of religion'" (p. 127). In addition to offering Lewis's objections to Hume, Wielenberg gives Lewis's positive argument on behalf of belief in the Resurrection.

According to Wielenberg, Lewis rejects what he calls Hume's Probability Principle which says, roughly, that we should proportion our belief to the experiential evidence and to it alone. Lewis argues that we cannot rely on experience alone. For experience to justify, we must be justified in thinking that the Principle of the Uniformity of Nature (PUN) is true which says, roughly, that the unobserved will almost always be like the observed. But we cannot be justified in believing in PUN on the basis of experience alone. So insofar as Hume's argument against rational belief in miracles on the basis of religious testimony alone depends on the Probability Principle, it is flawed.

Further, if we are justified in believing in PUN, it must be on the basis of reason. But if Lewis's argument from reason were successful, then we would be justified in believing in a Higher Power. And, Lewis thinks, if we are justified in believing in a Higher Power and believing that IF there is a Higher Power and it has certain attributes, THEN it likely would intervene in nature in miraculous ways, then we could not discount religious testimony in the way Hume proposes. Then, contra Hume, it could be that it is rational to believe, on the basis of religious testimony, that a miracle occurred. Lewis apparently held that such is the case when it comes to the Resurrection of Jesus: it is more rational to believe that the Resurrection occurred than that those who reported the surrounding events were either deceived or deceiving.

Wielenberg grants that if it were reasonable to believe that a Higher Power exists and "could and would intervene in nature in a particular way" (p. 148), then Hume's argument would be undercut (pp. 147-48), but he denies that Lewis has given arguments that make it rational to believe that a Higher Power exists (pp. 151-52). One might also question Lewis's assertion that we are justified in believing the Probability Principle only if we are justified in believing PUN. To be justified in believing that all crows are black on the basis of certain experiences with crows, I do not also have to be justified in believing the following conditional: if I have such-and-such experiences of crows, then I will be justified in believing all crows are black. All that is needed is that that conditional be true, that I not be justified in believing it false, and that its antecedent is in fact satisfied. Similarly, I might be justified in believing the Probability Principle, or some claim based on it, even if I'm not justified in believing PUN is true, in so far as it is true, I'm not justified in believing it false, and certain things have been observed. If to be justified in believing the Probability Principle I have to be justified in believing PUN, why don't I have to be justified in believing some other principle before I am justified in believing PUN? And then an infinite regress looms. If we have to stop somewhere to stave off the regress, why not stop with PUN being true without our being justified in believing it's true?

In the first three chapters Wielenberg contrasts Lewis's views with those of Hume and Russell, but in the fourth and final chapter he examines "some areas of agreement among the three" (p. 153). He argues that (1):

Hume, Lewis, and Russell, therefore, are qualified evidentialists. Each maintains that there are properly basic beliefs that need no evidence (though they do not always agree what these beliefs are). But they believe that when it comes to beliefs that are not basic, we should always believe in accordance with the evidence available to us at the time. (p. 168)

On the design argument, Wielenberg argues that, "Lewis, Hume, and Russell all identified a fundamental weakness common to all design arguments. The furthest such arguments can take us is to the existence of some intelligent designer or other" (p. 187). None of the three thinks that the design argument can establish the existence of an all-knowing, all-powerful, wholly good being.

Finally, Wielenberg thinks that Hume, Lewis, and Russell all have a view of what true religion requires. While Wielenberg shows that the views of Russell and Lewis on this topic have something in common in that they both think that true religion requires "the conquest of the finite self by the infinite self" (p. 196), that is, devotion to ideals that go beyond self-interested concerns, he does not show that Hume's view has much in common with Russell's and Lewis's. He argues that Hume's view is that of Philo in the Dialogues on Natural Religion, which Wielenberg takes to be the view that there is a cause of the universe "that is probably something like a human mind" (p. 188), even though we can have no real idea of how specifically it is like, and unlike, our mind. True religion involves that belief and a certain "emotional response" to it that involves astonishment, melancholy, and contempt (p. 188), but it has "no implications for ordinary life" (p. 191). Of course, Russell and Lewis would disagree strongly with the last part of what Wielenberg attributes to Hume on true religion, and Lewis, unlike Russell, thinks true religion involves a belief in the Christian God.

Wielenberg writes very clearly and lays out premise by premise the arguments he considers. For the most part I agree with the objections to the arguments he attributes to Lewis, though I think that he misconstrues Lewis's argument that Naturalism cannot explain knowledge based on reason, and so misses the real objection to that argument. Further, I think there is an additional objection to Lewis's argument from Joy to the existence of a Higher Power. As promised, the last chapter does point out some areas of agreement between Hume, Russell, and Lewis, but it also brings out areas of disagreement that it soft pedals, for example, between Russell and Lewis on the meaning of "faith" and between Hume on one side and Russell and Lewis on the other on the nature of true religion.

God and the Reach of Reason is an enjoyable and informative read. Lewis scholars will have to decide whether it accurately represents his views and arguments. Wielenberg's presentation of what he takes to be the views and arguments is extremely clear, and his criticisms of them fair and charitable. There are not a lot of new ideas offered by Wielenberg on the problem of evil, the argument about miracles, or the three arguments from morality, reason, and Joy. But the objections he offers are sound. I recommend this book to anyone who wants to read a critical interpretation and assessment of C.S. Lewis's views on religion.