God as Reason: Essays in Philosophical Theology

Placeholder book cover

Vittorio Hösle, God as Reason: Essays in Philosophical Theology, University of Notre Dame Press, May 2013, 416pp., $48.00 paperback, ISBN 9780268030988.

Reviewed by Herman Philipse, University of Utrecht


God as Reason is a collection of essays, published between 1990-2011, in which Vittorio Hösle attempts "to find an interpretation of Christianity that is compatible with [his] commitment to reason" (p. viii). The term 'reason' is used here in a sense strongly influenced by German idealism, and also by Plato and Vico. Hösle presents himself as "today a Catholic", although "in his formative years" he was educated by Lutheran teachers (p xii). He avers that his endeavour to develop a rationalistic version of Christianity "perhaps . . . deserves some attention" in a time of "mindless religious fundamentalism, on the one hand, and aggressive atheism, on the other". Hösle is convinced "that religion will stay with us, outliving all grand theories of secularization" (p. viii). However, he does not tell the reader which reasons justify this expectation, apart from the claim that "the human being remains incurably religious" (p. 137). Perhaps it is merely the expression of a hope, or of faith.

In the six chapters of Part I ("Philosophical Theology"), Hösle develops his view that the "core of God is reason", so that God is also "found inside our core" (p. 10). In Chapter 1, he discusses some challenges to his rationalistic version of Christianity, such as why a rationalist needs a church, or how a rationalist can endorse the doctrine of the Trinity. Chapter 2 provides an overview of what Darwin and Asa Gray thought about evolution and religion, and it is argued briefly that Darwinism in biology does not exclude a teleological view of the world. For example, the mechanism of natural selection may have been chosen by God because the overproduction of living beings that makes natural selection inevitable is "an expression of the principle of plenitude" (p. 43).

In Chapter 3, Hösle examines to what extent the concepts of God endorsed by Leibniz, Hegel, and Hans Jonas are able to solve the problem of evil. He argues that Leibniz's version of determinism copes better with traditional problems than other versions because, for instance, Leibniz rejects body-mind interactionism (Chapter 4). Hösle also argues that if one defines philosophy as "the science of the principles of being", as we should, "the question of God" becomes "the focal point of philosophy" (Chapter 6, pp. 144-5). Finally, Part I contains an extensive dialogue between Philonous, Encephalus, Theophilus, and Hylas on the mind-body problem (Chapter 5).

Whereas Part I is predominantly systematic, Part II, "A Rationalist's Tradition: Interpretations of Classical Texts" is more historical, and is devoted to predecessors of Hösle's rationalistic approach to Christian faith. Chapter 7 offers a selective overview of the history of Biblical hermeneutics from Augustine to Gadamer. Unfortunately, important figures such as Herder or Schleiermacher are lacking, although the latter is mentioned several times in other chapters. Hösle interprets German idealism as the legitimate heir to a pneumatological conception of Christianity (Chapter 8). He provides a rationalistic interpretation of Anselm's Cur Deus homo (Chapter 9, co-authored with Bernd Goebel); and studies both the form and the content of four interreligious dialogues written by Abelard, Ramon Llull, Nicholas of Cusa, and Jean Bodin, respectively (Chapter 10). In Chapter 11, he discusses Cusanus' philosophy of mathematics in relation to religion, since according to Cusanus, "infinite figures should form the basis of philosophical theology" (p. 263). Chapter 12 contains a devastating dialectical criticism of Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling, since "Kierkegaard's concept of faith is not only philosophically absurd, but historically absurd as well" (p. 287). The book ends with a review of Charles Taylor's A Secular Age (Chapter 13), which Hösle concludes by claiming that "to God belongs modern secularism as well". The reason is that "Only the experience of the utter contradiction of a purely secular religion can lead to a deeper relation to God" (p. 312).

* * * * * * * *

These essays were originally written for diverse audiences. For example, while most chapters appeared earlier in philosophical or theological journals or volumes, Chapter 6 was written for the Festschrift für Bischof Dr. Josef Homeyer (1999). All the essays are eminently readable, and the notes contain the original texts of the many quotes translated by the author himself, at least to the extent that these originals were in French, German, or Latin. However, Hösle decided not to give the original Danish for quotations from Kierkegaard, "since only few readers could understand it" (note 9 to Chapter 12), and he confesses his ignorance of Arabic (note 4 to Ch. 10). Although quotes from the original Greek texts are also lacking, the polyglottal erudition of the author is impressive, a phenomenon that is perhaps more common in Europe than in the U.S. Five of the essays were originally written in German, and one in Norwegian (p. xii).

Another striking feature of the volume is the amalgamation of systematic and historical interests. Although Part I is predominantly systematic, the arguments adduced by Hösle are often based on, or simply quoted from, historical figures such as Leibniz, Kant, and Hegel. Similarly in Part II ,which is more historical, systematic interests often motivate Hösle's historical explorations. For example, the overview of the history of biblical hermeneutics in Chapter 7 aims at showing that the rise of critical historical Bible scholarship was "intellectually necessary". Yet, Hösle also wants to "sketch how, on the basis of rational theology, a hermeneutics of the Bible may be conceived that renders justice to the greatness and even holiness of this book without betraying the demands of rational autonomy" (p. 157). His rationalism in theology implies, among other things, that we cannot justify the authority of the Bible by an appeal to miracles, that we need independent knowledge of God's central values in order to interpret the Bible properly, because "the divine manifests itself in what has a particular closeness to its central values", and that "there can be many inspired texts, even in different cultures and traditions" (p. 183). I sympathize with this liberal view, but it remains unclear why, if all this is admitted, the Bible should have a greater authority than, for instance, Plato's dialogues or the writings of Jean-Paul Sartre.

Undoubtedly, what explains in part the particular mixture of historical and systematic interests in the volume is the fact that its author received his academic education in Germany (he studied philosophy, history of science, classical philology, and Indology in Regensburg, Tübingen, Bochum, and Freiburg, passed his doctorate summa cum laude and achieved his Habilitation in Tübingen), where many philosophers do not adhere to a strict disciplinary separation between systematic philosophy on the one hand and the history of philosophy on the other, and also the fact that he is deeply influenced by Hegel. Hösle justifies this mixture in the book by claiming that the history of philosophy is not manifestly progressive: "I am not at all convinced that there is continuous progress in the history of philosophy" (p. 251). He even speaks of "the stagnation, even the decline of philosophy" in our times (p. 137). Apparently, he thinks that quite often philosophers of the past are more instructive concerning specific philosophical issues than present-day analytic philosophers.

* * * * * * * *

It is this amalgamation of systematic and historical considerations that also constitutes the greatest weakness of the essays. On the one hand, Hösle nowhere develops systematic arguments for his philosophical claims that satisfy the standards of rigour endorsed by present-day analytic philosophers of religion, such as Alvin Plantinga, Peter van Inwagen, Richard Swinburne, Nicholas Everitt, Graham Oppy, or J. L. Schellenberg. Although there are some references to such contemporary analytic philosophers, there is no indication that Hösle has studied and digested their works, with the possible exception of Plantinga's reconstruction of the ontological argument for the existence of God (p. 4). Furthermore, references to contemporary explanatory studies of religion in the social sciences are lacking altogether.

On the other hand, the more historical essays nowhere specify clearly the state of the art of historical scholarship in order to raise exegetical or factual problems that have not yet been solved. For example, Hösle's summaries of the ideas of Darwin and Asa Gray concerning evolution and religion will offer nothing new to those who have some interest in these topics. The same holds for what our author says about Hegel, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Kant. It may be that Chapter 9, 10, or 11 are exempt from this criticism, but I do not have the expertise to assess the issue.

Let me illustrate my first criticism by an example. It is one thing to develop a rationalistic conception of God, but quite another to explain why it is intellectually warranted to believe that such a god exists. Concerning this latter issue, Hösle stresses two points. First, he suggests "confidently that the proofs of God's existence are by all means more powerful than many non-theologians and unfortunately theologians as well nowadays believe" (pp. 147-8). Second, he holds that "a philosophical theology that takes religion seriously will strive for a substantive justification of its claims" (p. 145), so that the reader will expect Hösle to provide such justifications. However, Hösle realises that "One's proof may . . . be the other's reductio ad absurdum: if someone regards the conclusion as utterly implausible, he will regard those premises that lead to it as confuted" (p. 5). Perhaps, then, we should interpret Hösle's attempts to argue for the existence of his rationalist god as examples of fides quaerens intellectum, and not as attempts to convince the unbeliever.

Even so, the arguments that Hösle offers are sketchy and unconvincing. He stresses several times that the two most important arguments for God's existence are the ontological and the moral argument. Of the ontological argument, he says that it is "surely the king among all proofs of God" (p. 149), and that "Alvin Plantinga's reconstruction is the most plausible candidate for a cogent version" (p. 4). But he does not spell out this version, or refute the many incisive criticisms that have been raised against it. However, if these criticisms refuted the best version of the ontological argument, how could Hösle still be justified in asserting that, by proposing the ontological argument, Anselm "can indeed lay claim to having achieved one of the most important intellectual accomplishments of humanity" (p. 149; cf. Chapters II-IV of Jordan Howard Sobel's Logic and Theism, Cambridge 2004, for a critical analysis of many versions of the ontological argument)?

The only version of the moral argument for the existence of God that I could find in the book is interlocked with a cosmological argument, and it goes as follows.

1. If it is not possible to ground ethical claims in descriptive claims, then the moral law has to be something that transcends the world.

2. It is not possible to ground ethical claims in descriptive claims.

3. Hence, the moral law is something that transcends the world (MPP, from 1, 2).

4. If it is not contingent that the moral law can have an effect in the world, then the moral law and the world cannot be two completely independent spheres.

5. The moral law cannot be anchored in the empirical world (from 2).

6. The empirical world has to be -- at least partially -- principled by a cause that transcends it (from 4, 5). (p. 148; cf. p. 4)

Let me mention merely some of the many problems concerning this unconvincing argument. First, there is the Humean objection that the cause inferred in (6) is not necessarily the god defined by Hösle. Secondly, if premise (2) simply means that one cannot validly deduce normative conclusions from descriptive premises only, it does not follow that "the moral law is something that transcends the world" in the sense that it has to have a divine origin, so that (1) is false. Furthermore, in order to explain that "the moral law can have an effect in the world", it is sufficient to refer to the facts that humans evolved and that they are able to grasp and apply moral laws. Again, there is no need whatsoever to assume the existence of a cause of the world that transcends it, as conclusion (6) says.

All in all, we may conclude that these essays show the impressive erudition of the author. But if one expects a well-articulated rationalist conception of God, or convincing arguments for the existence of such a god, the reader will be disappointed.