God, Belief, and Perplexity

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William E. Mann, God, Belief, and Perplexity, Oxford University Press, 2016, 257pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190459208.

Reviewed by Ashley Dressel, College of St. Scholastica


This volume brings together fourteen of William E. Mann's previously published essays on Augustine, Anselm, and Abelard, examining a rich variety of topics from the widely discussed, like Anselm's ontological argument, to those that receive less contemporary attention, like Augustine's remarks on infant sin. Perplexity finds its way into most chapters: Mann raises questions he does not always answer, points to puzzles he believes Augustine, Abelard, and Anselm left unresolved, and examines the function of the aporetic in Augustine's works explicitly. The book jacket notes that the essays in this work complement those found in Mann's God, Modality, and Morality. While this is certainly true, the connections between the volumes are not overt and the books diverge substantially. Hence, I do not attempt to detail their connections here.

If the volume has one significant shortcoming, it is its structure. Mann divides the book into three sections devoted to Augustine, Abelard, and Anselm in turn. These vary substantially in their length and breadth. The section on Augustine fills 144 pages and eight chapters, covering a multitude of topics including Augustine on infant sin, dramatic theater, dreams, lying, and the problem of evil. Abelard receives paltry attention: his section consists of one twenty-page essay on his ethical writings and focuses, in part, on Abelard's debt to Augustine. Anselm receives 75 pages divided into five chapters, but four of those five treat his ontological argument. The fifth treats Anselm on the Trinity and there, exploration of Augustine's legacy returns. Mann admits that if his "A-team has a captain, it surely is Augustine" but the extent to which Augustine and his influence permeate the volume may leave one wondering why the book is divided by author at all (6).

The essays themselves vary in length, from six pages to 29, and differ in depth and accessibility. Some, like "Augustine on Evil and Original Sin", treat broad topics in a manner that would be appropriate for a neophyte. Others, like "Definite Descriptions and the Ontological Argument", a sixteen-page critique of Jan Berg's attempt to formally reconstruct the ontological argument utilizing Russell's theory of descriptions, are narrow and specialized. The diverse, independent, character of the chapters may come as a welcome feature to the more expert reader, allowing her to read those of most interest at will. For others, this feature could be jarring.

Structure aside, this is a valuable collection of provocative essays on topics of interest and import to both historians of philosophy and those working in philosophical theology. The first section, on Augustine, focuses largely on his ethics, especially his remarks on evil and wrongdoing. The first five essays form an unofficial sub-section, treating topics that perplex Augustine in the early books of his Confessions.

"The Philosopher in the Crib" takes on Augustine's denial of infant innocence in Confessions, Book I. "The only innocent feature in babies", Augustine memorably claims, "is the weakness of their frames; the minds of infants are far from innocent" (1.7.11). In Book I, Augustine appears to attribute to infants not only the effects of Original Sin, but also the capacity for active wrongdoing. While many would dismiss Augustine's remarks as excessive misanthropy, Mann examines them seriously, entertaining several strategies to salvage infant purity.

Mann spends much space on a defense of infant purity many will find implausible: an argument inspired by Donald Davidson's "Thought and Talk" according to which infants are incapable of wrongdoing because, without language, they cannot have emotions or desires (16-22). Mann ultimately rejects this argument and, with some brevity, turns to the position that even from an Augustinian perspective, infants are unable to have the sorts of intentions required for true, culpable, wrongdoing (22-23). This chapter ends in perplexity. Mann does not answer the question, "Can infants have sinful intentions?" and he points to several additional questions at the chapter's closing (25-26).

Those familiar with the topic are likely to lament the fact that Mann does not bring in Augustine's remarks on the importance of infant baptism in his anti-Pelagian works. Despite this, the chapter represents a useful introduction to the topic's complexities and highlights the import of this discussion to a full understanding of Augustinian ethics.

The next two chapters, "The Theft of the Pears" and "Pride and Preference: A Reply to MacDonald", both treat Augustine's pear theft. As those familiar with the Confessions are well aware, Augustine agonizes over his youthful decision to steal some unenticing pears. In "The Theft of the Pears", Mann attempts to determine why Augustine finds his apparently banal act so concerning.

Mann concludes that the problem for Augustine lies in the fact that he stole the pears for the sake of sinning -- "the motive of the theft was pure malice" (29). Furthermore, Mann argues, Augustine is not perplexed because sinning for the sake of sinning is impossible. In fact, Mann claims that denying the possibility of sinning for the sake of sinning would amount to denying the possibility of moral weakness (33-34). Surely, however, it would not. Paradigmatic moral weakness involves knowing wrongdoing, but it does not involve sinning for sinning's sake. The person who, from moral weakness, gluttonously devours her friend's piece of birthday cake, does what is wrong for the sake of the cake, not for the sake of the sin.

Mann argues that Augustine's perplexity comes from the fact that the sentence 'x sinned for the sake of sinning' is logically odd -- it presents "a causal explanation . . . [that] fails to locate a cause" (34). Sinning for the sake of sinning, Mann argues, originates from a desire to choose a lesser good over a greater one just because one wants to do so. This desire is causally inexplicable (35-36).

Mann brings this analysis of the pear theft to "Pride and Preference: A Reply to MacDonald", where he rejects Scott MacDonald's classic analysis of the act. On MacDonald's analysis, pride, involving an inappropriate valuation of goods, plays a decisive role in the pear theft. Mann does not believe Augustine needed to see anything good in the act at all, nor does he believe there is textual warrant to claim that pride was involved in the sin (47-51). Augustine's act, Mann reiterates, was a pure case of sin for sin's sake.

"The Life of the Mind in Dramas and Dreams" attempts to connect two topics that perplex Augustine in the Confessions: the enjoyment of tragic theatre and the apparent sinfulness of some dreams. In both cases, something substantive and potentially troubling appears to take place in the agent's inner life. While Mann thinks Augustine does not entirely resolve his perplexity on either topic, he argues that Augustine's ultimate inability to disavow responsibility for his dreams rightly bothers him more deeply than the paradox of theatre (76).

"Augustine on Evil and Original Sin" presents an accessible introduction to Augustine's views on evil. Here, I highlight three bold interpretive claims Mann makes. First, he claims that Augustine is not committed to the idea that our world is the best world God could have created (80). Second, leaning on this, Mann makes the case (also present in his chapters on the pear theft) that for Augustine, acts of sin need not have a cause. Just as God could freely and knowingly create an inferior world, human beings can freely, knowingly, choose inferior goods over superior ones for no reason whatsoever (83). Mann's suggestion that Augustine would consider the ability to work evil without reason analogous to God's power to freely create an inferior world is, to say the least, controversial. It would be worth exploring whether this assertion aligns with Augustine's position that the human beings are freer in heaven, where they cannot sin. Third, as he does in his reply to MacDonald, Mann argues that Augustine does not think pride is a necessary component of all sins (84).

"Inner-Life Ethics" is the first chapter to move its focus away from the Confessions. It presents Mann's overview of Augustine's ethics, emphasizing Augustine's focus on the inner life. Mann argues that sin occurs for Augustine when one inwardly consents to a pleasurable suggestion (92; 98). One of the most striking views Mann attempts to attribute to Augustine is the view that mere "wishful thinking", in the form of pleasurable fantasizing about some wrongdoing, renders one guilty of the wrongdoing contemplated (100-101). Hence, taking pleasure in fantasizing about adultery would leave one guilty of adultery itself. The move that deserves further exploration here is the move Mann makes from the notion that Augustine would think fantasizing involves consent to sin, to the suggestion that Augustine would think fantasizing involves consent to the sin one fantasizes about.

"To Catch a Heretic: Augustine on Lying" offers a detailed discussion of Augustine's remarks on lying. Mann notes that for Augustine, the agent's intentions play the determining role. If an agent utters a falsehood with the intent to deceive, she lies. If she has no intent to deceive, she does not lie, even if she utters a falsehood (117). One of the more nuanced questions Mann explores is: what does Augustine think about a person who says something true, intending to deceive? He concludes that Augustine should count this as a lie as well (125). Mann remains less certain about how to assess a similar case: a person who speaks deceptively but truthfully, without the intent to lie (133).

"Perplexity and Mystery" weaves together Mann's commentary on two articles: Gareth B. Matthews's "The Socratic Augustine" and Peter King's "Augustine on the Impossibility of Teaching". The first half explores the tension between Augustine the dogmatic thinker and Augustine the aporetic thinker. Mann proposes that Augustine's questions throughout his works should be taken as rhetorical when they concern tenets of faith and genuine when they concern issues of no consequence to salvation (138-141). The possible odd man out on this analysis, as Mann acknowledges, is Augustine's discussion of time (141-142).

The second half focuses on Augustine's account of teaching. King argues that Augustine's illuminationism makes teaching mysterious (perhaps impossible), but Mann disagrees (144-145). Mann concludes the chapter with a number of suggestive remarks that provide one type of answer to King's worries (147).

"Abelard's Ethics: The Inside Story" forms the second section of the volume. This chapter complements Mann's chapter on Augustine's moral theory, since Mann considers Abelard's focus on the agent's intentions a sign of Augustine's legacy. Mann acknowledges, however, that Abelard diverges from Augustine in divorcing sin from desire. On Abelard's account, one can consent to a sin even without wanting to perform it (154-155).

This rich chapter contains a number of noteworthy discussions. In one section, "Sinning Through Mistaken Belief", Mann perceptively highlights an apparent tension between Abelard's moral assessment of a judge who, in discharging his duties, punishes someone he knows is innocent, and his moral assessment of Christ's persecutors. This discussion brings in Abelard's under-studied comments on Natural Law (168). Mann ends the chapter with several conjectures, including speculation on the intended content of Abelard's unfinished second book of his Ethics (170-172).

The third and final section consists of four chapters on Anselm's ontological argument (henceforth, OA) and one on Anselm on the Trinity. Mann's four chapters on the OA represent a break with the rest of the volume in at least two respects. First, unlike most chapters, they do not touch on moral theory. Second, they represent the only place in the volume where explicit mention of Augustine drops out. While Mann argues in his introduction that Augustine is still present, because the Proslogion itself is the product of Augustinian "faith seeking understanding", there is a distinct tonal break here (6-7).

The first two essays treat the form and content of the OA. In "Definite Descriptions and the Ontological Argument", Mann critiques Jan Berg's application of Russellian logic to the argument, claiming that unlike Russell, Anselm assumes we can predicate truly of things that do not actually exist in re (183). Anselm's distinction, Mann argues, between existence in the understanding and existence in reality is what prevents the OA from being circular, and so the argument is better expressed by a free logic à la Karel Lambert (190).

"The Ontological Presuppositions of the Ontological Argument" attempts to draw out several presuppositions of Anselm's OA, including the distinction above between in re and in intellectu existence. Mann argues that while Anselm's distinction between two modes of existence might tempt one to translate the OA into modal logic, modal logic does not readily accommodate Anselm's further implicit distinction between conceiving and conceiving to exist (196-197). Finally, Mann argues that even when we understand the presuppositions behind the OA more clearly and take them together, they "still yield no convincing proof for the existence of God" (205).

The third and fourth essays both focus on Gaunilo's classic "lost island" refutation of the OA. Gaunilo's refutation is a reductio, attempting to show that the structure of Anselm's OA could be used to "prove" the in re existence of the greatest conceivable island. In "The Perfect Island", Mann attempts to answer Gaunilo's critique on Anselm's behalf. "Locating the Lost Island" reverses some of Mann's conclusions in "The Perfect Island", raising further trouble for the OA on Gaunilo's behalf. Mann spends much of the article examining possible interpretations of Anselm's ambiguous "greatness principle" (GP): "For if it is in the understanding alone, it can be conceived to exist in reality also, which is greater" (217). Mann claims Anselm "is or should be receptive to" a version of the GP on which anything that exists in reality is better than anything that exists in the understanding alone (227 -228). This is a substantial claim worth further exploration.

The section, and the book, end with Mann's "Anselm on the Trinity". Here, both perplexity and Augustine's legacy reappear more clearly. The notion of the Trinity, as Mann points out, is one of the central mysteries of Christianity: how can one render divine simplicity compatible with divine triplicity (236)? Mann presents a complex and useful examination of Anselm's use of Augustinian analogies in his work on the Trinity. Mann points out that, in the end, even Anselm believes his analogies are imperfect and so the Trinity remains mysterious (249).

Ultimately, Mann's volume is a philosophically stimulating collection, and his emphasis on perplexity throughout serves as a welcome reminder that the questions we raise can be as consequential as the ones we manage to answer.