God in the Age of Science?: A Critique of Religious Reason

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Herman Philipse, God in the Age of Science?: A Critique of Religious Reason, Oxford University Press, 2012, 400pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199697532.

Reviewed by Andrew Pinsent, University of Oxford


Any book with the title God in the Age of Science? risks appearing to beg the question of whether or not we still live in what used to be called the age of science and, if so, what kind of science. The cover image, a famous painting in 1768 by Joseph Wright, An Experiment on a Bird in the Air Pump, depicts an early scientific experiment in the reverential manner of a religious scene such as a nativity. The reader is presumably invited to draw the lesson that science supplanted religion sometime in the eighteenth century, but this painting also has surprisingly macabre overtones. The onlookers are not gathered religiously around the crib of Christ, but watching with curiosity and horror as a bird is slowly suffocated by an early air pump. Whether intended or not, the cover therefore raises fascinating moral and social questions about the scientific enterprise that would have been interesting to explore but unfortunately are not addressed within the book itself.

The subtitle, however, "A Critique of Religious Reason" communicates more clearly the author's intent, namely to provide a critique not just of one kind of religious reason, but all religious reason. By the end of the book, Philipse concludes that if we aim to be "reasonable and intellectually conscientious," we should become not just agnostic but "disjunctive strong" (343) or "strong disjunctive" universal atheists (346). By the latter he means we should conclude that:

Either religious believers have not succeeded in providing a meaningful characterization of their god(s), or the existence of this god or these gods is improbable given our scientific and scholarly background knowledge. (343)

Given this sweeping conclusion, the variety of religious beliefs, and the history of arguments about theism, one would therefore expect a massive volume covering a vast range of topics, but in practice much of this book is a more focused critique of the arguments offered by Richard Swinburne. Philipse argues that his general conclusion is warranted, however, since "natural or rational theology is indispensable for the conscientious religious believer" (4) and the natural theology developed by Swinburne is, he claims, "the 'toughest case' for the critical philosopher of religion" (91). To summarize metaphorically, it is as if the last chance to secure a foundation for the throne of God is to rest on the shoulders of the Emeritus Nolloth Professor of the Philosophy of the Christian Religion at Oxford and, if he has failed, as Philipse argues he has, the game is pretty much all over for God.

Philipse goes about this ambitious task in a series of commendably clear steps. In Part I, he argues that statements such as the assertion that God or some other god exists have to be interpreted as claims to truth, the only philosophically interesting option. Once Philipse has disposed of the challenge of the reformed objection of Alvin Plantinga et al. in chapters 3 and 4, he concludes that if assertions about God are claims to truth, they have to be backed up by positive apologetics (64). Given, however, that we are living in the age of science, Philipse argues that the natural theologian is faced with a dilemma he calls "The Tension" (89): either to justify theological claims in the manner of scientific methods and theories, which involves making empirical predictions with negligible chances of success, or risk being too dissimilar from scientific and scholarly rationality to be credible (90). As either option is unpalatable, he argues that the best option for the theist is to accept a probabilistic account of scientific and scholarly methods as consisting in rules of inference to the best explanation, "which enable us to assess how probable a hypothesis is in the light of an evidence-set," the approach he ascribes to Swinburne (91).

This conclusion sets up Part II, which considers the question of "whether theism really is an explanatory theory or hypothesis, which can be confirmed by empirical evidence" (341; 95-188). The beginning of this part is devoted to an attack on the "coherence of theism" (after Swinburne's book of the same title), a major theme being that "theists implicitly annul the very conditions for meaningfully applying psychological predicates to God by claiming that God is an incorporeal being" (341, 95-119). The following chapter then examines the question of the necessity of God. Philipse argues that there is a conflict between Swinburne's characterization of God as a bodiless person and the thesis that "God miniessentially is a personal ground of being" (134) and, since Swinburne himself has to resort to analogy, "we should conclude that theists do not succeed in giving any meaning to the word 'God'" (341). Nevertheless, assuming for the sake of argument that theism is a meaningful theory, Philipse devotes the rest of Part II to arguing that it lacks any "significant predictive power" (160), that specific evidence adduced to confirm theism inductively can be better explained by rival secular explanations and that other countermoves fail, notably an appeal to miracles such as the Resurrection and phenomena that are "too big" for science. Such phenomena include the cause of the Big Bang, the fundamental laws of nature being what they are and the fact that the universe appears 'fine-tuned' (161-188).

Part III considers the probability of theism assuming that it does have some predictive power and evaluating claims to be able to explain the state of the cosmos on this basis. This section offers critiques of cosmological arguments, arguments from design and an assortment of other arguments and their defenses, concluding with a chapter on religious experience that refutes the attempt to shift the burden of proof to the non-believer (191-337).

The number and complexity of these issues precludes making more than a few observations. In my judgment, many of the tactical steps of this book are well argued, notably chapters 3 and 4 on Reformed Theology, as well as the critique of the notion of the personhood of God (109-119) on the basis of natural reason and the discernment of anthropomorphically-oriented divine purpose on the basis of cosmic order (187, 278). Indeed, Philipse is at his best, I think, when he challenges claims belonging to revealed theology that have been appropriated and presented as natural theology. Cultural influences make it hard for many philosophers today to draw this distinction clearly, which is one reason I judge it is normally better practice to go to classical sources, such as Plato and Aristotle, if one wants genuinely to establish what might be known about God or the gods on the basis of natural reason alone. Nevertheless, it should also be pointed out that many theists would actually agree with Philipse's criticisms. Is natural theology inadequate to regard God as personal? Spaemann has already said as much.[1] Can we discern purposeful action by God in the cosmos by natural reason (256-278)? Newman denied this.[2] Aren't suffering and evil difficult to reconcile with God's existence and goodness (292-309)? The Book of Job raises the same issue and with great subtlety.[3] Are our concepts inadequate for characterizing God? The Jewish people knew this nearly two and a half millennia ago, which is why they used circumlocutions to refer to God and forbade the holiest name to be spoken, and also why Christian theology is based on the understanding that the only word adequate for God is God, the Word made flesh. So although Philipse's arguments may help to purify the proper domain of natural theology from unwarranted claims influenced by revelation, his conclusions on these points are not precisely new. Considering Philipse's overall strategy, however, I have some serious concerns.

First, a serious examination of natural theology usually presupposes, or takes a view or presents some case for a particular understanding of causation, which alone gives us access to knowledge of remote forces and agents of any kind. For this reason, philosophers in the past who constructed very diverse arguments relating to God, such as Thomas Aquinas or David Hume, were similar insofar as they prioritized the issue of causation. By contrast, Philipse says very little in a positive sense about what he means by a cause, either using the term in passing without reflection or restricting his brief comments to denying particular views of causation advanced by others (for example, the doctrine of "double causation", 236-237). He rejects the view that laws of nature are causes:

laws of nature neither are causes of phenomena, nor can be caused themselves, for it does not make sense to ask, for example: 'what caused the inverse square law of attraction?' (235).

In response, I would say that laws of nature presumably shape our predictions of phenomena, so at least one kind of phenomena, scientific predictions, are indubitably caused at least in part by the laws of nature. Consider, however, the last part of Philipse's claim, part of his attack on Swinburne's argument that laws of nature can be brought into operation by God.[4] Philipse asserts that it does not make sense to ask what caused the inverse square law of attraction, shutting down further enquiry, but this example is unhelpful since it is wrong. The inverse square law is a consequence of deeper principles, notably the conservation of flux in a three-dimensional space, and the relevant number of dimensions may itself be a contingent consequence of the early physical evolution of the cosmos. Physicists, at least, do not consider it nonsensical to enquire into such matters. The deeper issue, however, is that although Philipse is emphatic about what kinds of things cannot be causes, his positive account is ambiguous. He does refer to phenomena 'causing' other phenomena, such as the moon and tides (235), and things sustaining other things by direct contact (193), but it is unclear what he thinks of immaterial or formal causation generally, whether only physical things are causes or whether we can know anything about causes at all beyond correlations of observable phenomena.

A second and related problem concerns domains, especially the proper domain of what is meant by God in natural theology and the domain of science. At certain points, it is ambiguous whether Philipse is attacking the validity of proofs of a first cause or necessary being generally, the traditional domain of reasoning about 'God' in philosophy, or an expanded understanding of the divine that includes, for example, personal attributes. Philipse often uses traditional terminology, such as "cosmological arguments" but most of the book seeks to deny the validity of arguments in support of the specific God of Swinburne's version of theism as a "theory". An example is when Philipse raises the possibility of an omniscient, omnipotent, and morally indifferent god (MIG) as a rival hypothesis to theism (316) and makes the odd point that the necessity of God would raise a problem for theism as a "theory" (120).

The problem is that a focus on undercutting proofs for a specific theism under the banner of traditional terminology risks confusing readers, undermining the stated aim of building a case for universal atheism and obliterating a target that many other theists would take issue with anyway. I was also left curious to know what possibilities Philipse himself advocates or might be willing to accept as an impersonal uncaused cause or causes of the cosmos, or whether he thinks the reliability of our inferences in trying to resolve such questions simply breaks down at some point. To adapt the metaphor of the doomed bird in the air pump on the cover, even if Philipse has succeeded in killing off the bird (read now as a symbol of Swinburne's theory of theism), it is not apparent what he has left behind, apart from a vacuum.

With regard to the domain of science, Philipse places great value on the power of scientific methods to make predictions. In chapters 6, 9, 10, 11 and at many other points he argues repeatedly that theism has no significant predictive power and compares it unfavourably with science on this basis. In adopting this strategy, Philipse is unquestionably correct that the power of prediction is one of the great successes of modern science, the anomalous magnetic moment of the electron being predicted and tested to more than ten significant figures. Nevertheless, as one goes to higher levels of complexity than those natural systems that can be modelled as aggregates of two-body systems, science becomes less a matter of prediction and more a matter of discovering and unifying phenomena under common explanatory frameworks, as is the case, for instance, with zoology. Philipse acknowledges this point indirectly by citing Stephen Jay Gould to the effect that "'almost every interesting event of life's history' is a matter of historical contingency," a conclusion that, though contested, cannot easily be dismissed because of the difficulty of predicting what living things will evolve from particular initial conditions (196, fn. 20).[5] By the time that one reaches the humanities, including philosophy, one is rarely in the business of making predictions at all.

So by placing so great an emphasis on prediction as a litmus test of success in a scientific age, Philipse runs the risk of doing too much, of cutting away not just God as a "theory", but those sciences that are not in the business of making predictions, along with the humanities as well. Philipse does seem to verge on taking this step, criticizing Heidegger, Levinas and Jean-Luc Marion among others on the basis that their approaches to questions of natural theology "seem to have zero reliability in the pursuit of truth," but why stop with them? (85). How much of philosophy generally is commensurate with the methodology of science, and does Philipse's own book pass this test? Moreover, even without any predictions capable of distinguishing competing hypotheses, one can have an intelligent discourse on ways to unify the same phenomena under different explanatory frameworks, but far more subtle work on this topic was done in the twentieth century by John Wisdom's "Parable of the Invisible Gardener," by subsequent commentaries and the development of the philosophy of perception, which Philipse does not refer to at all.[6]

Third, this book is written, at least in part, "for colleagues and students in university departments of philosophy and theology," (xi) with a stated aim of avoiding the accusation of chasing "paper tigers" by failing to engage with sophisticated arguments for theism (xii). To accomplish this goal, however, Philipse has to address, and quickly dismiss as unreliable or contradictory, any knowledge that is derived from revealed theology in order to establish the priority of natural theology, the main target of his critique in the remainder of the book. Philipse devotes chapter 1 and parts of chapter 10 to this task, but many of the arguments he puts forward in his critique of revealed theology are too brief and superficial to establish credibility with his colleagues in those areas of the academy that specialize in such matters. To give an example, he asserts that in his first letter to the Corinthians (15:35-50),

Paul seems to deny that Jesus was resurrected with his earthly or physical body, arguing that he was raised with a new, spiritual and heavenly body (sooma pneumatikon), since 'flesh and blood cannot inherit the kingdom of God' (5; cf. 173-174).

Philipse uses this slender claim to support his case that there are contradictions within the New Testament that make any revealed theology drawn from it unreliable, but in theology, as in science, a single counterexample, even if genuine, rarely suffices in itself to overthrow a paradigm. Moreover, as Keener has pointed out, Paul's letter elsewhere uses "spiritual" for "of the Spirit," Collins refers to sooma pneumatikon as an "inspirited body," and Paul often contrasts life according to the flesh and the spirit without implying any lack of physical continuity between these states (cf. Gal 3:3). The issue is subtle, but Paul does not deny the empty tomb and the Gospels concur that Jesus' resurrected body is transformed. A judgment of harmony or contradiction is largely a matter of one's presuppositions.[7]

The complexity of this last issue has a bearing on a more general conclusion. This book might have been successful as a focused critique of excessive and poorly justified claims that are sometimes made in the name of natural theology. Indeed, I shall find parts of this work valuable in future on that basis. The problem, however, is that in attempting to demolish the coherence of what is meant by God, all reasoned proofs for God's existence and all religious reason in one go, I think the author simply attempts too much.

[1] Robert Spaemann, Persons: The Difference Between "Someone" and "Something" (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006), 40.

[2] John Henry Newman, "The Religion of the Day," in Parochial and Plain Sermons: Volume I, New ed. (London ; New York: Longmans, Green, 1891), Sermon XXIV.

[3] For an insightful new interpretation of the problem of suffering addressed by the Book of Job, see Eleonore Stump, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2010), 177-226.

[4] Richard Swinburne, The Existence of God, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2004), 142-143.

[5] On this point, Philipse cites Stephen Jay Gould, Wonderful Life: The Burgess Shale and the Nature of History, 1st ed. (W. W. Norton Co., 1989), 290-291.

[6] See, for example, J. Wisdom, "Gods," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 45, New Series (January 1, 1944): 185-206.; Michael Polanyi, Science, Faith and Society (London: Geoffrey Cumberlege, Oxford University Press, 1946). and Larry R. Churchill, "Flew, Wisdom, and Polanyi: The Falsification Challenge Revisited," International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 3, no. 3 (1972): 185-194.

[7] See Craig S. Keener, 1-2 Corinthians, New Cambridge Bible Commentary (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), 130-135. and Raymond Collins, First Corinthians, ed. Daniel J. Harrington, Sacra Pagina (Liturgical Press, 1999), 562-568. For an overview of diverse presuppositions and their effects on Scriptural interpretation, see Stump, Wandering in Darkness, 32-35.