God, Knowledge, and the Good

God Knowledge And The Good

Linda Trinkaus Zagzebski, God, Knowledge, and the Good, Oxford University Press, 2022, 347pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197612385.

Reviewed by Derek Christian Haderlie, Brigham Young University


This volume is a collection of papers from Linda Zagzebski’s work in the philosophy of religion. She organizes eighteen (lightly edited) papers around eight themes: Foreknowledge and fatalism; the problem of evil; death, hell, and the resurrection; God and morality; omnisubjectivity; the rationality of religious belief; rational religious belief, self-trust, and authority; and God, Trinity, and the metaphysics of modality. Despite the fact that some of the essays in this volume date back as early as 1985, the philosophy still feels fresh. With her characteristic clarity and precision, Zagzebski guides her reader through familiar territory into entirely new insights in the philosophy of religion.

While reading this volume it is easy to see the seeds of ideas that were later developed in many of Zagzebski’s books. Given this fact, one might wonder what value this volume might have for the philosopher who already has copies of Divine Motivation Theory, The Dilemma of Freedom and Foreknowledge, and others on her shelf. I think the answer to that question is system. In other words, by bringing these papers together into a single volume, Zagzebski puts into her readers’ hands the evidence of a profoundly systematic approach to philosophy that would otherwise be difficult to observe by consulting individual texts on their own. The essays span 32 years of work across a wide array of topics and questions, and yet it is striking how unified the essays are. By revealing Zagzebski’s underlying systematizing concepts, the value of the volume is greater than the sum of its parts.

Zagzebski’s philosophy remains timely because her philosophy is deeply concerned with how one should live the Christian life. Despite modeling academic philosophy at its very best, she also models how to do philosophy in a way that is connected to the lived experience of a Christian believer. As she says in her introduction, she began her career working in the philosophy of religion in part “because of [her own] religious commitments” (11). She begins chapter 12 by claiming that “A curious feature of current American religious epistemology is the lack of engagement between religious believers and their skeptical interlocutors. Unlike most other areas of philosophy, those writing in religious epistemology do not see themselves as part of the same epistemic community, using common concepts and working together to answer the same questions” (213). This passage is notable for two reasons. First, it evinces Zagzebski’s concern that philosophy should connect to the lived experience of everyday people, not just professional philosophers. And second, it is in community that the religious life is lived. Philosophers therefore have a responsibility to the larger communities of which they are a part.  Throughout the essays included in this volume, it becomes apparent that the notion of community is at the heart of Zagzebski’s philosophy. It is not only thematic but forms a crucial ground for much of her theorizing. It is in communities that we work “together to answer the same questions.” In the remainder of this review, I will survey a few examples of the role that community plays in her philosophy in order to exhibit its unifying and systematizing power in Zagzebski’s philosophy of religion.

The notion of community is central to Zagzebski’s religious epistemology. She says that the search for truth (religious or otherwise) is a “communal project” that philosophers (and non-philosophers alike) engage in together (220). This joint project is so important, she thinks, that “the value of such a joint project is closely related to the value of philosophy” (221). In a community, we are responsible to each other. In this context, we can understand her notion of a second-personal perspective. This perspective sits between the first-personal subjective perspective and the third-personal objective perspective. “When we see ourselves only from the inside, we get a distorted view and we are not likely to [epistemically] improve ourselves. But to look at ourselves in the third person is to see ourselves as an object, as just one person among others” (254). The second-personal perspective allows us to avoid these problems. When we take up this perspective, we see ourselves as members of a community. As members of a community, we are persons not objects, but we also see ourselves from the outside as someone in our community might see us and avoid the distortions of seeing ourselves only from the inside. “Part of good internal functioning is being a member of an epistemic community whose members are responsible to each other” (223). She claims that epistemic “communities constitute an important link between the individual’s efforts and success at getting the truth. In fact, we cannot even tell whether the individual has succeeded in getting the truth apart from being a good epistemic agent, which means good internal functioning in consort with that of the various epistemic communities of which we are a part” (224). It is from the second-person perspective that we can best observe and discharge our epistemic responsibilities to our communities. It is notable that both the notions of an epistemic community and the notion of a second-personal perspective are grounded in community.

Of course, such a strongly community-based epistemology raises unique worries. Suppose that Smith has independently gathered evidence that suggests that, say, the earth is spherical. Unfortunately for her, regarding the truth, Smith’s community is a flat-earther community. So, her community not only fails to help Smith get at the truth, but it confounds her ability to do so. Zagzebski claims that “any epistemic mismatch between the agent and her community normally means that she is not functionally well internally” (223, first emphasis mine). Zagzebski acknowledges that a community can be mistaken, and it is for this reason that we should be members of many communities. But this will not solve things if all the communities that Smith participates in are flat-earther communities.

Like her religious epistemology, Zagzebski’s moral theory is grounded in community. In several of the papers we see the first seeds of Zagzebski’s exemplarist virtue theory that she later developed in her book Divine Motivation Theory. She does this to good effect, providing a distinctively Christian ethical theory focusing on the person of Jesus Christ as The Moral Exemplar.  This situates the incarnation as the central moral event in history, since in addition to atoning for the sin of Adam and Eve, “the purpose of the incarnation was [. . .] to give us a perfect moral exemplar” (172). In chapter 10, she puts to work the theory of direct reference developed by Saul Kripke (1980) and Hilary Putnam (1975). Roughly put, we define natural kind terms by ostension. For example, we define gold by pointing and saying, “that stuff right there, that’s gold.” This fixes our terms, even if we don’t have access to the nature of gold. Likewise, we can fix our moral terms (e.g., virtuous, praiseworthy, etc.) by ostension even when we don’t have access to the nature of the virtues and so forth. But this only works if we have an exemplar that we can point to and say, “that person there is virtuous.” Of course, any mere mortal will fall short of being fully virtuous. But Jesus as The Divine incarnated does not fall short. And so, it is Jesus that ultimately grounds our epistemic access to the virtues. How is this theory grounded in community? First note that the theory of direct reference requires a linguistic community. And second that our epistemic access to the fundamental moral facts (facts about the person Jesus and his motivations) is profoundly social. It requires a moral community. (Including, in our case, artifacts of religious communities such as The New Testament.) So, despite the fact that she doesn’t emphasize the role of community in these papers, it is partly constitutive of the theory.

As I see it, Zagzebski’s theodicy is also grounded in community. The problem of evil, she argues, hinges on a consequentialist assumption about the motivational structure of a good being. In chapter 5, she formulates the assumption in the following way: “The goodness or badness of persons is derivative from the goodness or badness of the states of affairs they aim to bring about or prevent” (97). On such a view, God’s motivation is consequentialist. By contrast, on her agent-based approach, God’s motives are themselves what are good and bad, not the consequences of God’s actions. As she says in chapter 9, “moral properties [are] derivative from God’s motives” (163).  Thus, God’s act of creation springs from the motive to create rather than because he seeks some creative outcome. By rejecting the consequentialist assumption built into the problem of evil, Zagzebski rejects the crucial premise that leads to a conflict between the existence of God and the existence of evil. Like a loving parent, God gives us autonomy because he loves us and that is the way a loving God would act, not because autonomy is a valuable consequence (81). Zagzebski points out that this analogy can only go so far, but she does seem committed to a motive of love. Take note of two features of Zagzebski’s theodicy. First, her theodicy hinges on a social notion of morality—one that grounds morality in God’s person rather than in commands or abstract properties or facts. Second, to emphasize God’s motive of love is to emphasize a peculiarly social motive since love is other-regarding. Insofar as love involves communion with the beloved, if God loves us then he seeks communion with us.

But this makes Zagzebski’s theodicy especially vulnerable to the problem of alienation. We can bring this problem out by considering horrendous evils and religious trauma. Marilynne McCord Adams characterizes horrendous evils as morally unproductive, life-ruining evils (2000, 26). One life-ruining result of horrendous evils is alienation from God. Alienation from God is also a result of certain kinds of religious trauma. Consider the following fictional account inspired by real events described by Michelle Panchuk:

A young child is repeatedly and brutally beaten by her Christian parents. She is told that since God commanded the Israelites to stone their rebellious children, anything they do to her short of that is divinely approved and morally deserved. And she believes them. One night, they lock her out of the house as punishment for some misdeed. Sitting alone, bruised and bleeding, gazing at the stars, the girl has an overwhelming sense of the presence of God—a presence utterly terrifying because she perceives it to be of a being who delights in her suffering. (514)

Given Zagzebski’s community-grounded theodicy, the problem of alienation cannot simply be brushed aside (nor do I think she would want to do so). For on the one hand, we have good reason to think God is motivated to seek communion with us by virtue of his love for us. Christ himself says, “And I, when I am lifted up from the earth, will draw all people to myself” (John 12:32).  But on the other hand, in creating us and granting us autonomy, God has acted in such a way as to frustrate His divine motive of love by allowing alienating evils.

In this review I have emphasized the important and central unifying role of community in Zagzebski’s philosophy of religion. There are many other examples from the volume where community is central. In chapter 7, Zagzebski’s suggested solution to the problem of the resurrection (the problem of how our identities can be preserved and we survive resurrection) hinges on social relationships. In chapter 11, she argues that God has the attribute of omnisubjectivity, which is an inherently social notion. In chapter 16, her novel argument for the existence of God is inherently social. In chapter 15, she provides an account of religious authority that is crucially grounded in a religious community.

I conclude that the value of this volume comes from the contribution it makes to revealing unnoticed connections in Zagzebski’s philosophy of religion. It provides good evidence that she is a deeply systematic philosopher.


Adams, Marilyn McCord. Horrendous evils and the goodness of God. Cornell University Press, 2000.

Kripke, Saul. Naming and necessity. Blackwell Publishing, 1980.

Panchuk, Michelle. “The shattered spiritual self: A philosophical exploration of religious trauma.” Res Philosophica 95.3, 2018, 505-530.

Putnam, Hilary. “The meaning of ‘meaning’.” Mind, language, and reality (Philosophical Papers), vol. 2, Cambridge University Press, 1975.

Zagzebski, Linda Trinkaus. Divine motivation theory. Cambridge University Press, 2004.

Zagzebski, Linda Trinkaus. The dilemma of freedom and foreknowledge. Oxford University Press on Demand, 1991.