God, Locke and Equality: Christian Foundations of Locke's Political Thought

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Jeremy Waldron, God, Locke and Equality: Christian Foundations of Locke's Political Thought, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 263pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521890578.

Reviewed by Victor Nuovo, Harris Manchester College, Oxford/ Middlebury College


In God, Locke and Equality , Jeremy Waldron argues that Locke’s mature writings present an idea of basic human equality, grounded in Christian theism, and that this idea is “a working premise of his whole political theory” whose influence can be detected in “his arguments about property, family, slavery, government, politics, and toleration”. Waldron also argues that contemporary liberalism lacks just such a well founded and versatile idea as well as the resources to supply it. Its self imposed secular stance is the reason for this deficiency. Since Locke’s idea of human equality is rooted in theism, it is only reasonable that contemporary liberalism should relax its restrictive stance and consider religious reasons such as Locke’s for its commitment to equality.

Two of the main theses of his book, that Locke’s mature works aim at a unified outlook that may be fairly characterized as liberal, and that this outlook is founded on Locke’s Christian beliefs are not new. John Dunn, who was the first to present Locke’s political theory in its religious context [The Political Thought of John Locke, Cambridge, 1968] has said as much in numerous places and Waldron acknowledges this. [For a succinct account of these theses, one that applies nicely to Waldron’s project, see Dunn’s Western Political Theory in the Face of the Future, 2nd ed., Cambridge, 1992, pp. 38-42.] What is new is Waldron’s assertion of the contemporary relevance of Locke’s Christian outlook for political thought, in particular as it pertains to human equality. This and his liberal optimism contrast sharply with Dunn’s pessimistic attitude towards the efficacy of liberal and democratic theory, especially Locke’s, just because it is rooted in theism. In the place just cited, Dunn refers to a brief handwritten note circa 1693 [Bodleian MS Locke c. 28, fo. 141; Dunn earlier adopted it as the motto of his previously cited book], in which Locke contemplates the consequences for mankind if there were no God and no divine law. The result would be moral anarchy. Every individual “could have no law but his own will, no end but himself. He would be a god to himself, and the satisfaction of his own will the sole measure and end of all his actions”. It should be observed that in this note Locke still attributes fundamental freedom and equality to mankind even without God, but the prospect for civil society, and even more for liberal democratic society, would disappear and in its place would appear a social condition that Dunn characterizes as ’dolefully Nietzschean’. According to Dunn’s view, Locke not only was able to imagine the consequences of ’the death of God’, he also in a sense anticipated it by his own failure to show that human rationality is sufficient to discover the theistic foundations of the political morality that he takes for granted in the second Treatise. This was the task that was promised but never fulfilled in Locke’s Essay. Locke’s argument for the necessity of revelation in The Reasonableness of Christianity is taken by Dunn as a tacit admission of this failure. In the light of all this, Dunn characterizes Locke as a tragic figure, whose greatness is manifest more in his intellectual courage to persevere in his enquiries than in his philosophical achievement. The lesson to be learned from reading Locke is a moral one, and it is well worth learning. On the other hand, any attempt to appropriate Locke for contemporary political theory is misguided. Even if one disagrees with Dunn, as I do, it must be admitted that his conclusions are based upon a remarkable sensitivity for his subject and a deep familiarity with Locke’s writings and their contexts.

Waldron directly challenges Dunn’s pessimistic interpretation of Locke and that of his intellectual predecessor Peter Laslett, whose critical edition of Locke’s Two Treatises more than three decades ago opened a new phase in the understanding of Locke’s political thought. Laslett contended that Two Treatises of Government and An Essay concerning Human Understanding represent different projects that Locke pursued more or less concurrently but never connected. As already noted, Dunn interprets this difference differently, offering a coherent view of Locke’s intellectual life and its endeavor, but not of its product.

Against Laslett and Dunn, Waldron proposes a robust account of the unity of Locke’s thought that he intends to make a vehicle in which to carry theological argument into contemporary liberal theory. But to succeed he must demonstrate a need for this sort of argument. Since contemporary liberal theory, at least in its dominant Rawlsian version, excludes Christian theism, along with all sorts of comprehensive moral outlooks, religious or secular, from political discussion, he must show that this exclusion is self-defeating, in particular, that it is an obstacle to achieving an adequate idea of basic equality. So Waldron pursues his campaign for the contemporary political relevance of Locke’s theism on two fronts, the one represented by Laslett and Dunn, the other by John Rawls.

In the third chapter of his book, Waldron presents arguments that are crucial to his project. Hence, this review will focus mainly there. In this chapter Waldron presents Locke’s idea of political equality and justifies it on grounds from which he argues for the inadequacy of Rawls’ secular counterpart. A secondary purpose of this chapter is to refute Laslett’s claim that the Two Treatises and the Essay are independent projects that ought not to be conflated.

According to Waldron an idea of fundamental equality must consist of two sorts of things: a set of one of more capacities, for example, rationality or physical strength, and some reason or purpose for which these capacities are intended and by which the lives of those who possess them acquire meaning and purpose. The strong attribution of equality to mankind in the Two Treatises seems to be subverted in the Essay by Locke’s species skepticism. In Essay III. vi. 9-28, Locke argues that the species term ’Man’ denotes a nominal essence, a collection of sensible ideas, that are, to be sure, rooted in nature, but taken together are not grounds for making a real distinction between mankind and other species. This applies to all our names of natural kinds, so that it would be a mistake to use them as a guide to a real system of natural species, or even to conclude that nature is a system of distinct species. Locke even dismisses an appeal to generation as a guarantee that a mother and her child belong to the same species. (Essay III. vi. 23). It should be noted that this directly contradicts Locke’s assertion in the second Treatise (§§ 4, 6) that God created mankind as a natural community, endowed with similar faculties, and infers their basic equality from what he takes to be a self-evident principle that “creatures of the same species and rank promiscuously [i.e. without distinction] born to all the same advantages of nature, and the use of the same faculties, should also be equal”, unless by a positive command of God one individual is set above all the rest to rule them. [In fact, Locke believed that God did set one individual over all, but one who wasn’t exactly a regular member of the human species, viz. Jesus Christ.] So Locke both asserted and denied (to be sure, in different books) that mankind is a real species whose members are without distinction born to an equal state.

Waldron argues that Locke found a way out of this inconsistency. He fell back to the fact that the perceptible qualities that constitute the nominal essence of mankind include “real resemblances”. Human beings are, for the most part, perceived to be corporeal beings who think, or more precisely, who are able to think abstractly, and it is on this basis that an idea of equality may be built. But rationality of this sort is not something one has or has not, but has more or less, so the basic condition of equality is a “range concept”, a term that Waldron borrows from Rawls. So corporeal beings who have the capacity to think abstractly are equal to one another, although some may manifest more or less rationality. But what is the point of being a creature so endowed? Locke’s answer, according to Waldron, is that whoever has this capacity is fit to discover God and the moral law of nature. The pursuit of these things and the endeavor to live by them gives meaning and purpose to every individual human life.

This derivation of basic equality seems to work, but it is not a derivation of equality that Locke intended. It is Waldron’s construction based on Locke. Moreover, it is arguable that Locke would not have thought it necessary, for he had no reason to believe that his argument in the second Treatise was deficient. Waldron remarks, in chapter 4, that the arguments in the second Treatise for equality and property acquisition are natural-law arguments. This is only half true. In fact, they are mixed arguments, based on reason and revelation. Since Scripture, which Locke believed to be infallible, asserts that Adam and the generations proceeding from him are one species or kind, and since revelation trumps rational doubt, Locke did not need to find another way to equality. This, of course, leaves the Essay and the Two Treatises as separate projects.

One advantage of Waldron’s construction of the idea of equality is that it facilitates easy comparison with Rawls. Rawls’ idea of basic equality consists of two capacities: the capacity of having a conception of one’s good (a rational plan of life) and a capacity for a sense of justice, together with standard rational capabilities, e.g. the ability to draw inferences and to think abstractly. These capacities constitute a moral person. (. Theory of Justice rev. ed., Cambridge MA, 1999, p. 442.) His idea of basic equality is richer than the one Waldron attributes to Locke. But there are resources in the Essay upon which Waldron might have drawn to fashion a Lockean version that is equally rich. I refer to Locke’s account of a person as a “Forensick Term” denoting “intelligent Agents capable of a Law, and Happiness and Misery” (Essay II. xxvii. 26), and his definition of freedom as a human agency determined by the good (Essay II. xxi. 47, 48 and passim). Waldron then contends that Rawls’ idea of basic equality is a “shapeless” set, because, unlike Locke’s idea, it lacks a transcendent reference from which the meaning and purpose of its parts derive. In Locke’s case this transcendent reference is to God and our duty, through which the happiness that we seek is assured. From Locke’s point of view any plan of life would not be rational if it did not have this aim. This doesn’t seem to me a fair appraisal of Rawls’ idea. It is at least arguable that the inclusion in it of the capacity to develop a plan of life regulated by a sense of justice provides it with an inbuilt source of meaning and purpose. Rawls’ idea thus seems simpler and has the advantage of self-sufficiency.

In the next to last section of the final chapter of God, Locke and Equality, Waldron raises another objection to Rawlsian exclusivism that seems more imposing. It relates to Rawls’ idea of public reason. [See Rawls Political Liberalism, New York: 1996, Lecture VI.] Public reason, on Rawls’ account, consists of all the reasons that ideally may be employed in a pluralistic democratic society to justify its basic institutions and to advocate fundamental justice. It is a restricted domain, excluding elements of comprehensive moral doctrines, whether religious or secular, from public discourse and deliberation; it regulates reasons that may be employed in the exercise of all public duties, including casting a vote. Waldron worries that this domain may be too restrictive and that in order to insure its adequacy it is necessary to include within it substantive doctrines over which there may be serious disagreement. Waldron suggests that Rawls’ idea of moral personality and Locke’s theism perform the same function of establishing a meaningful equality; both are intended as antidotes to nihilism. If this is so and if both are adequate, then it would seem arbitrary to include one and not the other.

So much for the basic argument of this very interesting book. Much of the rest of the book is devoted to demonstrating the influence of Locke’s idea of basic equality on his reflections concerning the family, the status of women, private property, social differentiation, and toleration. Any one of these chapters is worth the price of the book. After reading them, one cannot doubt that Locke took human equality very seriously and that, paradoxical as it may seem, it pervades the whole of his political thought.

I close with a critical comment. The title indicates that Locke’s Christian commitments are the basis of his idea of equality. Nevertheless, as Waldron remarks at the beginning of chapter 7, there is little that is explicitly Christian in the Two Treatises, where the idea of equality is most fully worked out and most forcefully asserted. He remarks on the few citations from the New Testament, in contrast to so many from the Old Testament, and wonders why this is so, especially in the light of John Dunn’s claim that the Two Treatises are infused with Christian content. The trouble is that Waldron never makes clear just what kind of Christianity Locke adhered to, except a vaguely Protestant sort. In fact, Locke’s Christianity was strongly messianic, which is to say, he believed that Christian doctrine must be understood as Scripture presents it, embedded in a sacred history that runs from the creation of Adam to the Last Judgment. In this connection, Locke adhered to the doctrine of divine dispensations. The proper place in this history to treat the themes of the Two Treatises is prior to the Mosaic theocracy and the founding of the messianic kingdom. The nature and function of the civil state are properly considered, then, only under the general providence of God which prevailed under the Adamic and Noachic dispensations. The counterpart of the Two Treatises is The Reasonableness of Christianity, whose central theme is the founding of the transcendent Kingdom of God. The difference between the two realms and their respective authorities is a central theme of the Epistola de tolerantia. In the light of this, Laslett was correct when he remarked that Locke’s major writings represent separate projects. He was wrong to suppose that they do not cohere. Indeed they do when viewed from the standpoint of Locke’s particular Protestant vision. I believe that Waldron’s case for the unity of Locke’s thought would be strengthened by a richer account of this vision. I am less sure that contemporary liberalism would find such a vision relevant.