God, Modality, and Morality

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William E. Mann, God, Modality, and Morality, Oxford University Press, 2015, 369pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199370764.

Reviewed by Michael J. Almeida, University of Texas at San Antonio


This impressive collection includes sixteen previously published essays and one written specifically for this volume. They uniformly display William E. Mann's ease and erudition in philosophical theology, smoothly weaving together contemporary thought with deeper medieval insights on the nature of God, necessity, and morality. There is a sustained clarity in exposition and a partiality to suggestive analyses and solutions to these issues found in Augustine and Aquinas.

The collection is divided into three sections. The first provides an account of a simple and perfect God. (1) Divine simplicity looms large throughout the volume. It is true to say that God is omniscient, omnipotent and morally perfect, on Mann's account, though simplicity entails that God has no parts or properties. The second section concerns God and modality. The focus is primarily on the compatibility of sovereignty and divine freedom, and this includes a close examination of how necessary truths might depend ontologically on God. Mann argues for an analogy between the divine establishment of necessary truths and the promulgation of basic moral principles. (2) In both cases, he defends a form of divine voluntarism. Crucial to the discussion is Mann's particular account of divine simplicity. The third section concerns theistic foundations for morality. The main goal is to answer the Euthyphro challenge. The answer again involves a defense of voluntarism and the elusive metaphysics of divine simplicity. It is an unexpectedly lighter issue that divine command theory does, and should, allow for genuine moral dilemmas.

I'd like to begin with a brief point on Mann's philosophical method. In general his approach to the problems in philosophical theology is to offer thoughtful proposals rather than knock down arguments. It's a prudent choice, though no doubt some will find it frustrating. The method affords him considerable dialectical flexibility. Even when it is obvious that he is committed to some philosophical thesis -- the thesis of divine simplicity, for instance, or divine voluntarism -- he does not consider it settled which determinate versions of these is true or even most likely true. The essays explore a big question: "what difference would God's existence make to the world and its inhabitants?" (1). And Mann's answers, though informed and subtle, are suitably exploratory.

The initial chapter, "The Divine Attributes", discusses an atypical coherence problem for the traditional attributes. The problem is not how anything could be omnipotent and morally perfect -- can't omnipotent beings lie? -- or how anything could be omnipotent -- can't omnipotent beings create unliftable stones? -- it is rather that at least some divine attributes are degreed properties, e.g. knowledge, power, or benevolence. If a property that contributes essentially to the greatness of God has no intrinsic maximum, then there lurks a challenge to the coherence of the greatest conceivable being. (7)

What's the challenge? The argument goes roughly this way. Suppose knowledge has no intrinsic maximum. If so, then no matter the degree of God's knowledge, there is some possible being y, such that y is just like God except that y has more knowledge than God. So, y is greater than God. And so there is no greatest conceivable being. The immediate problem is that, perhaps, y just is God. If so, it might be that knowledge is degreed and no possible being exceeds the knowledge of God. It might be that God's knowledge in any world exceeds the knowledge of any non-God in any world. God's knowledge in some worlds would then be exceeded only by his knowledge in other worlds. But then no possible non-God exceeds God in knowledge.

In "Divine Simplicity", Mann aims to defend the doctrine of divine simplicity according to which God is identical to the properties of God -- deity-instance identity -- and the properties of God are identical to each other -- instance-instance identity. The doctrine of divine simplicity plays a central role throughout his discussions of divine sovereignty, aseity, and freedom. It is particularly prominent in discussions of God and the metaphysics of modality and value.

In defense of instance-instance identities, Mann relies on, among other things, principle (C).

(C) Property instances the F-ness of x and the G-ness of y are identical if and only if (1) the property of being F is necessarily coextensive with the property of being G and (2) x = y. (36)

But necessary coextension is a very low standard for identity statements to meet. Mann considers a number of objections from Plantinga, but there are other, perhaps more serious, obstacles. Compare the properties existing in the actual world α and existing in possible world β. Those are necessarily coextensive properties for anything existing in each of those worlds, and so by (C) their instances are identical. But how can we conclude that x's existing in α is identical to x's existing in β unless α = β? Generalizing to all purported x-worlds, (C) entails that x exists in exactly one world, and x has all of her properties essentially. Indeed, it follows that we all have all of our properties essentially and we all live strongly fatalistic lives. I don't believe either is true.

Combining all of the identities necessary for divine simplicity yields the identity of God's abilities or powers with God's substance with God's goodness with God's choices with God. We get metaphysical claims like God's omnipotence = God's substance = God's reason = God's will = God.

Mann acknowledges the Plantingan objection to such a view that we have a very strong intuition that no property instance is a person. (37) Mann's rebuttal aims to show that property instances might instantiate the properties of persons, e.g. the properties of being alive, knowledgeable, capable of action, powerful and good. But to establish the identity of these kinds of things, property-instances and persons, it's not enough to show that every property of persons is a property of property-instances. The identity is not eliminative -- there are property instances and there are persons -- so it must also be shown that every property of property-instances is a property of persons. It must be shown, for instance, not just that property-instances have the property (instantiated by persons) of being knowledgeable, but also that persons have the property (instantiated by property-instances) of being non-knowledgeable. And finally it must be shown that x (= person = property-instances) is such that x has all of the properties of both property instances and persons. That is, for instance, x is knowledgeable and non-knowledgeable. It cuts corners to insist that properties were never non-knowledgeable after all or that persons were never knowledgeable after all.

Compare: since gold is identical to its chemical kind, we expect the kind diamond to be identical to its chemical kind.[1] But the chemical kind of diamond = the chemical kind of graphite = carbon. So, by transitivity, graphite = diamond. But then all of the properties -- manifest or not -- of graphite must be properties of diamond, and vice versa. So, x (= graphite = diamond) must have all of the properties of both diamond and graphite. So, for instance, x conducts electricity and x does not conduct electricity. It cuts corners to insist that diamond never had the property of failing to conduct electricity or that graphite never had the property of conducting electricity.

Establishing informative instance-instance and deity-instance identities, while cutting no corners, is extremely difficult to do. This of course is part of what makes divine simplicity so difficult to establish. Divine simplicity entails a set of extraordinarily informative identity statements.

In "Simplicity and Immutability in God", Mann argues that the doctrine of divine simplicity (DDS) entails the doctrine of divine immutability (DDI). The argument, in brief, is that DDS entails that God is eternal, and God's eternality entails God's immutability. (47) The open question is whether anything that satisfies DDS and DDI would be a person. In answering this question Mann notes:

So, although an eternal, immutable being cannot wax wroth, remember, forget, calculate, or fall in love, such a being can know, will, love, and know that it knows, and thus be the subject of certain kinds of states or activities of consciousness. The repertoire of kinds of states of consciousness available to an eternal, immutable being may thus be somewhat restricted: there is no reason, however, to think that the curtailed repertoire threatens the candidacy for personhood of such a being. (48)

It may not threaten the candidacy for personhood of such a being -- under some set of criteria for personhood -- but it certainly seems to threaten the omnipotence and omniscience of such a being. If God is unable to experience the suffering of his creatures -- or anything like the suffering of his creatures -- then he does not know what it is like to suffer in those ways. If such a being cannot experience anger or feel mercy or justice, then the being seems neither omnipotent nor omniscient.

In "Immutability and Predication: What Aristotle Taught Philo and Augustine", Mann discusses Aristotle's views of idionic predication according to which P is an idionic predication of A just in case P is not essential to A, but, necessarily, all and only As have P. In short, A has P as a matter of de re necessity, but P is not part of the essence of A. Mann's main claim is that Philo and Augustine put Aristotelian idionic predication to work in defense of divine sovereignty and aseity. According to Mann's Philo, it is a part of God's idion to act. If that's right, then only God acts, and nothing else does. (69) According to Philo, an utterly immutable being can also be supremely active. But it is worth asking here whether God's action in the world, on this account, is not merely apparent action.

"Epistemology Supernaturalized" assumes that God is omniscient and explores one possible explanation of how God knows all that he knows. (73) The account specifically focuses on knowledge of contingent fact. Mann argues that God's knowledge of contingent fact is knowledge of the contingent a priori (88). God's knowledge of all contingent fact is [1] a priori [2] non-inferential [3] uncaused by contingent facts [4] generated by stipulation. (88) The account is interesting, but it does raise (as Mann well knows) particular problems for God's knowledge of free action that go beyond the standard problems of freedom and foreknowledge.

In "Divine Sovereignty and Aseity", Mann defends a traditional view of divine sovereignty according to which God creates ex nihilo and continuously sustains the universe. Mann addresses a problem of evil for this account of conservation according to which it is impermissible for God to conserve agents that engage in serious wrongdoing. Mann offers some counterexamples to a principle that might support such intuitions and concludes that "Until shown otherwise, a theist is entitled to assume that divine conservation, insofar as it allows evil to occur, is non-culpable". (101) But the approach is not especially convincing. We don't need a supporting principle to know that Smith ought to stop Jones from beating his dog to death. Why doesn't God also have some requirement to stop it or mitigate it? That's the old problem of evil. Without God's intimate metaphysical help, Jones could never have beaten the dog to death. Why is God such an enabler? That's the newer problem. We do not need a moral principle to feel the force of these questions. And theists really don't seem entitled to assume that all's morally well with God's enabling Jones to beat the dog to death.

The aim in "Omnipresence, Hiddenness, and Mysticism" is characteristic of Mann's general philosophical approach. He writes: "I am concerned here not to argue that belief in God's omnipresence is true. My concern is rather to see what sense can be made of the belief, especially in light of the fact that God's omnipresence is not obvious" (119). There is a discussion of two varieties of omnipresence: pantheism and panentheism, the former expressing the view that God is everything and the latter that God is in everything. One might wonder why there isn't the possibility that God is everywhere, but neither in anything nor identical with everything. There is an interesting discussion of Aquinas on omnipresence. God is present everywhere as a mover or cause of all things to exist from moment to moment. God is simple on this view, and divine creativity ensures that God is present everywhere or immanently in the created world -- causing it and sustaining it. (128)

In "Necessity" Mann discusses an apparent paradox. If God is necessary, then there seems to be one necessary truth for which God is not responsible. But if God is sovereign, then God is responsible for all necessary truths. (145) Mann opts for an Augustinian strategy in resolving the paradox. Propositions depend for their existence on God (they exist in the mind of God, if at all). But it is not the case that God can make a contingent proposition necessary or a necessary proposition contingent. The dependency of these propositions on God is not that sort of dependency. "it is God's knowing that p is necessarily true that explains p's being necessarily true rather than the other way around". (151) But, of course, God's knowing = God's reasoning = God's willing = God's commanding, and so on. Divine simplicity again does the heavy metaphysical lifting. Necessary truths are a product of God's will, which just is God's reason, which is God's knowledge. Of course, once again, whatever x = God's will = God's reason = . . . would, it seems, have to have all of the properties of reason, all the properties of will and so on. For instance, it seems that x would have to be both constrained and unconstrained.

In "Modality, Morality, and God", Mann begins by addressing the Euthyphro problem. He argues that there are absolute, unchangeable, moral values and those values owe their absoluteness to God. (164) Since God's will is perfectly good, we can think of the perfect goodness as "constraining" what God might will. The absolute values are simply the expression of a morally perfect will, as the necessary truths are the expression of a perfectly rational will. But the familiar problem for divine simplicity rearises. If x = God's perfect goodness = God's will, then x is both constrained (property of perfect goodness and rationality) and unconstrained (property of will). The identification of God's will with God's goodness does not eliminate the will and its properties, nor does it eliminate perfect goodness and its properties. It rather tells us that, surprisingly, they are the same thing, and therefore something has all of the properties of each. How anything could have such diverse, seemingly incompatible properties is a problem for divine simplicity.

In "God's Freedom, Human Freedom, and God's Responsibility for Sin", Mann considers three views on freedom and argues that God's freedom is different from human freedom. God's freedom in some ways threatens human freedom, but ultimately is compatible with it. (170).

In "The Best of All Possible Worlds", Mann explores the consistency of two attributes of God: maximal freedom and perfect goodness. Perfect goodness seems to entail that God creates the best possible world and maximal freedom seems to entail that God might have created many possible worlds. (196) Mann argues, once again, that there are necessary truths (including those about value) that God could not have altered and that nonetheless depend on God's will. (218) God's will is causally responsible for them. The doctrine of divine simplicity entails that God's will = God's intellect, so the voluntarist and the rationalist, in some sense, come together. There is no genuine debate without the false assumption that God's reason is distinct from God's will.

But again we ask what this could mean. When we voluntarize rationality, does that mean that reason becomes unconstrained and God might rationally actualize any world whatsoever? Or when we rationalize the will, does that mean the will becomes constrained and God cannot voluntarily actualize any world whatsoever? Which happens? The right answer for simplicity has to be both, but how could it be both?

"Theism and the Foundations of Ethics" addresses, once again, the Euthyphro argument. Mann argues for a theistic ethical theory that provides a solution to the problem. (228). "The Metaphysics of Divine Love" aims to explain how a perfect being could love beings that are so clearly imperfect. (251). Mann contrasts Harry Frankfurt's arationalist view of divine creation with Leibniz's rationalist view of creation. On Frankfurt's view, God's creation has no further point other than to be an expression of God's love. (254) On a Leibnizian rationalist approach to creation, God does not create out of love, but for moral reasons: God optimizes in creation. The debate is between Frankfurt's voluntaristic God and Leibniz's rationalistic God. It is divine simplicity that resolves the conflict in creation between reason and will. According to Mann, the problem in both Leibniz and Frankfurt is the separation thesis: the idea that the intellect (reason) is distinct in God from the will. Mann urges instead that God's creation is the result of both God's reason and God's will, since God's reason = God's will.

"Jephthah's Plight: Moral Dilemmas and Theism" discusses two theses: (i) whether there are moral dilemmas and whether we are responsible for finding ourselves in them and (ii) whether it is especially bad for theistic moral theories that they generate moral dilemmas. There is some discussion of secundum quid dilemmas: the idea that all moral dilemmas are the result of our moral failure. (275-7) Considerable discussion is devoted to showing that Aquinas did not believe that all dilemmas are secundum quid. Mann argues that the case of Jephthah, for instance, is one Aquinas considered a dilemma simpliciter and not secundum quid. (284-5). Mann urges that it is possible for theists to allow for genuine moral dilemmas. First, he argues, theists should abandon ought-can, in order to avoid the charge of inconsistency. But the recommendation is a radical response to the consistency problem, and maybe wrongheaded. It's not enough to reject ought-can to permit the right sorts of moral dilemmas. Other standard theorems have to go. Mann argues, second, that dilemmatic situations are occasions for repentance, forgiveness, and mercy wherein the offense displayed in moral dilemmas might be absorbed in God's infinite love. (294)

"The Guilty Mind" argues interestingly for the central role of intention in the assessment of culpability. Several cases are adduced to test the intention condition on culpability. In the cases of lying, for instance, it is urged that intent to deceive is a necessary condition on lying. But it is hard to see why one could not lie unintentionally: what if the password is "Austin's in Alabama". I utter it and you, not knowing the password, head out for Austin Alabama. (299-300) Mann has some discussion of the role of motives, in addition to intentions, in determining the degree of culpability of moral agents. Again the argument is for greater consideration of intentions in assessing culpability in self-defense cases. (312)

"Piety: Lending a Hand to Euthyphro" elucidates the argument in the Euthyphro, aiming initially not to read those arguments anachronistically. Some help is offered to Euthyphro from a Christian perspective on questions concerning whether piety might benefit God and impiety offend or harm God. Finally, in "Hope" the main aim is to discuss why hope is counted among the great virtues of faith, hope and charity. (336) Is it different from faith and love and if so is it valuable thing to have? Mann argues for the affirmative. There is some interesting discussion of Luther on hope. Hope has no space in Luther's account of the purest love one can have for God. For Luther the pure love of God requires, first, the hatred of oneself (as sinners, that is the attitude God expects of us). But then how can one hope for one's salvation? (344). There is simply no room for (even enlightened) self-interested desire or belief in the context of seeking pure love of God. Mann argues, following Aquinas, that hope and charity are theological virtues necessary for salvation, contrary to Lutheran pure love.

These essays all raise very interesting issues in philosophical theology. It is fascinating to observe the role Mann assigns to divine simplicity in resolving so many of them. Anyone working in metaphysics and philosophical theology will certainly benefit from the painstaking attention Mann affords to simplicity and its surrounding issues.

[1] See Mark Johnston, 'Manifest Kinds' Journal of Philosophy 94 (1997): 564-583. Note also that relativizing the identities to specific carbon allotropes doesn't help.