God: Reason and Reality

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Anselm Ramelow (ed.), God: Reason and Reality, Philosophia Verlag, 2014, 377pp., $121.00 (pbk), ISBN 9783884051092.

Reviewed by Michael J. Almeida, University of Texas at San Antonio


This book includes ten chapters focused largely on the knowledge and attributes of God. There are chapters on Bayesian approaches to the epistemology of Christian history, the possibility and evidence for miracles, the coherence of divine impassibility and some new work on theological fatalism. Many of the chapters are written from an exclusively Thomistic perspective that does not engage much (and certainly not fruitfully) with contemporary work in metaphysics, epistemology or philosophy of language. Some of the chapters -- in particular J. F.X. Knasas's 'The "Suppositio" of Motion's Eternity and the Interpretation of Aquinas' Motion Proofs for God' -- amount to little more than minor intramural squabbling.

I'll provide a brief overview of each chapter, with special emphasis on William Wainwright's 'Divine Impassibility', Linda Zagzebski's 'Divine Foreknowledge and the Metaphysics of Time' and Anselm Ramelow's, 'The God of Miracles'. I should note before proceeding that the collection is not well edited. There are numerous typographical errors, logical notation is missing at crucial points and there are grammatical errors throughout. The errors begin in the table of contents and proceed throughout the text with persistent mistakes in paragraph formatting, spacing, spelling, etc. The collection would have benefitted greatly from a closer review prior to publication.

In 'What do we mean when we say "God"?', Robert Spaemann begins with a discussion of what we mean by the name 'God', but quickly slips into the question of what 'God' refers to and whether different theistic traditions refer to the same thing with the word 'God'. It's odd and regrettable that there is literally no discussion of alternative theories of reference (causal, descriptivist) or how such theories might be appropriate for the term 'God'. Spaemann seems to be committed to a causal/Kripkean theory of reference (24), but it's hard to know what view of reference might be in play. There is also some conflation of conceptual and metaphysical questions in the discussion. Spaemann just asserts that God's primary property is omnipotence (27), which is conflated with the subsequent assertion that "The first definiens of God [sic] is therefore power, more precisely: absolute power" (27). What follow these assertions are some observations on how we should act in response to such a being.

In 'Monotheistic Rationality and Divine Names: Why Aquinas' Analogy Theory Transcends both Theoretical Agnosticism and Conceptual Anthropomorphism', Thomas J. White focuses on Aquinas's view of the way in which knowledge of the properties of creatures permits (or does not) knowledge of the properties of God. (37) There is a brief discussion of Aquinas's notoriously difficult analogical view of divine predication according to which a predicate attributing a property to a creature (e.g., Bob is good) attributes a similar, but not identical, property when applied to God (e.g., God is good). The good-making properties of creatures (good, caring, compassionate, loving, etc.) are not properly the properties of God, but they are not metaphors either. When we assert that God is powerful, we say something true, though the property that 'powerful' expresses, as we utter the word, is not strictly the property that God possesses (or, strictly, the property that God is identical to). Alternatives to this view include optimistic univocal views of predication -- Richard Swinburne defends such a view -- and pessimistic negative theological and radical apophatical accounts. According to the latter, Aquinas's analogical account of divine predication already goes too far, amounting to 'conceptual idolatry' in its approach to describing God. (41) The remainder of this lengthy (seven sections) and interesting chapter focuses on whether Aquinas's account is true and whether it helps us in understanding the nature of God.

Lawrence Dewan, in 'Thomas Aquinas and Knowledge of a God as the Goal of Philosophy', is also concerned with the knowledge of God from a Thomistic perspective. We find in this chapter part of Aquinas's suggested method of coming to know God: by negation, or by noting what God is not. Knowledge of the divine nature, in Thomas, begins with the study of sensible substances, and proceeds by the negation of the composites to the simplicity of God. (101) Dewan concludes that the concept of God is a basic for philosophy; indeed, it is urged that nothing could be more basic or foundational. And knowledge of God is the final cause for most philosophical endeavors. (121)

Stamatios Gerogiorgakis ('Bayesian Theism and the Interpretation of Bayesian Probabilities')  labels 'Bayesian theism' those arguments for the existence of God and other parts of Christian faith that employ Bayesian confirmation theory. Gerogiorgakis' project is most closely associated with the work of Swinburne. Much of Gerogiorgakis' discussion focuses on the problem for Bayesians of assigning prior probabilities. (131) He advances two principles for determining priors: the principle of simplicity and the (Keynesian) principle of indifference. Strangely he makes no mention of Bertrand's paradox and does not provide much argument in favor of the two principles. In response to traditional objections to the assignment of prior probabilities, Gerogiorgakis urges that Bayesians may rightly underscore the subjective interpretation of probability to justify a selective approach to the use of the principles of simplicity and indifference in the assignment of priors. As he observes, Bayesians are in general not intimidated by the charge of applying the principles in an ad hoc way, and it provides a solution to an array of problems for the assignment of priors.

The fifth chapter, noted above, is primarily an exercise in Thomistic scholarship with a discussion that is sunk in the weeds of motion proof interpretation. In chapter six, 'Shades of Simplicity', Paul Thom attempts to analyze divine simplicity in terms of predicational monism. The idea roughly is that a predicate F applies truly to God only if God is (must be) all, only, and completely F. The implication of predicational monism is that God is identical to his properties or perfections and that God possesses simplicity (181). Thom offers several matrices that display clearly the views of Augustine and Boethius, among others, on the issue. On the other hand, the matrices offer no explanation of how these views might be coherent. The discussion gets cloudy quickly, but that might be the difficulty of the issue. For instance, if <God is omniscient> is true in virtue of the fact that God = omniscience, then we have a true identity claim. How do we manage to retain the view that omniscience is nonetheless being predicated of God? The author states that "the matrix tells us that the being x (x = God) falls under the concept d (= being wise) and also under the d's abstract (183, my emphasis). But the talk of 'falling under' is difficult to make out. These are all identity claims, so there aren't any objects falling under any concepts. It's in any case very difficult to see how, and Thom does not offer much help. In closing, he provides a sampling of medieval thinkers and their notions of divine simplicity; he shows that some of them endorse, to varying degrees, something like predicational monism.

In 'The God of Life, the Science of Life, and the Problem of Language', Michael Dodds aims to clarify the meaning of the phrase the living God through a (partial) analysis of both 'God' and 'life'. (197). According to him, God utterly exceeds our understanding, and so does life. Dodds pursues both scientific (biological) analyses of 'life' and philosophical analyses. There is some useful discussion of what it means to speak analogously of divine life.

When we talk of the 'life' of God and the 'life' of creatures, we are not speaking equivocally, as we might talk of the bark of a tree and the bark of a dog. Nor are we speaking univocally, as if the word 'life' had exactly the same meaning when applied to God and to an amoeba. Our language is therefore not merely metaphorical, as when we speak of a 'living' organism and 'living' water. When we speak analogously about God we know that what we are saying is true, but we do not really know what we are talking about. (209-10)

Dodds notes in closing that when we speak about the living God we use the way of causality (that God caused the creatures that exist, and therefore that God exists), the way of negation (that God exceeds his creation), and the way of eminence (that God superexceeds all that he has made in his perfection). God has life eminently, and does not merely fail to have inanimate life or cause creatures to live. (210)

Wainwright ('Divine Impassibility') takes up two puzzles connected with the property or attribute of impassibility. According to him, impassibility is the property of being (i) causally unaffected by objects/events outside of oneself and (ii) independent of objects/events outside of oneself. (233) The puzzles arise because, if God is impassible (unaffected by the world), then he lacks first, knowledge of the world, and second, compassion for those suffering in the world. The knowledge puzzle assumes that knowledge requires a modification in the knower. The natural response here is that God knows in the way a Laplacian demon might know: he creates everything, including the laws (perhaps including statistical laws), and knows a priori all that follows from them. But Wainwright is concerned that (for Molinists at least) counterfactuals of freedom hold independently of God's creative activity and God would have to come to know them in some causal way. But this, too, is false, even assuming Molinism. God knows a priori exactly what would happen were he to place creatures C in circumstance T, for all C and T, though what are known a priori are contingent truths. So, there is no need to know them in any causal way. God's creative activity determines, in this case, too, which propositions are true. Of course the relevant propositions exist necessarily (presumably) and independently, but that isn't a serious worry for a coherent notion of impassibility. Dubiously coherent views to the contrary notwithstanding, neither metaphysical space nor necessarily existing objects have any dependence on God. So, Wainwright's conclusion that God is not impassible in this sense seems hasty.

The second puzzle concerns God's experience of compassion. Wainwright notes that all the major theistic traditions attribute compassion to God. (260) According to Wainwright, 'if a divine person suffers in any nature [human or divine], that person is not impassible in all respects. It follows that the doctrine of divine impassibility is not true without qualification.' (267) But we can reasonably wonder why. God knows a priori each bad event that will occur, though each of those events is contingent. His knowledge of such events does not require that he stand in any causal relation to them. And the compassion such events elicit does not require that he stand in any causal relation to them. If what God knows a priori elicits his compassionate responses, then God's experience of compassion is not incompatible with divine impassibility.

In 'Divine Foreknowledge and the Metaphysics of Time', Zagzebski argues that the problem of divine infallible foreknowledge and free will disguises a deeper set of problems that have nothing to do with infallibilism, God, or free will. (275) In fact, she aims to show (in three steps) that the traditional problem of theological fatalism is an instance of a more general metaphysical problem and only incidentally a problem about God or free will. (275) But what we find instead are lots of different problems lurking around the problem of theological fatalism, none of which is credibly construed as just a specific instance of another.

After presenting the traditional argument for theological fatalism, Zagzebski urges that 'the argument is clearly intended to demonstrate the incompatibility between infallible foreknowledge by any being whatsoever and human free will.' (280) She suggests further that, whether or not God exists, there would still be a metaphysical problem of free will and infallible foreknowledge. (281) But it is worth considering whether, were God not to exist, infallible foreknowledge of the sort that conflicts with free will would be coherent: perhaps nothing in any possible world would possess it. If so, then trivially the troublesome sort of foreknowledge is incompossible with free will -- and everything else. So, it's not a metaphysical problem worth worrying about.

Zagzebski then moves to a more general problem in the vicinity of the traditional problem of theological fatalism. The general problem concerns the possibility of (i) a temporally asymmetric modality that transfers over entailment and (ii) the existence of true propositions about the past that entail propositions about the future. (287) She rejects (i), arguing there is no 'necessity of the past' for which there is no corresponding 'necessity of the future'. But there is an unpreventability of the past (i.e., a causally unpreventable past) that does (or seems to) transfer over entailment, and that does generate an argument for theological fatalism. But this argument should not be cause for concern. No doubt, the past is unchangeable. No doubt as well, the future is unchangeable. Whatever is actually true, by well-known and well-accepted principles, is necessarily actually true (i.e., Ap ⟶ ☐Ap). So there is simply no changing what is actually true; there's no changing what actually will occur and more than what actually did occur. There is also no denying the transfer principle (☐(q ⟶ p) & Aq) ⟶ ☐Ap. So, if q is actually true, and q entails that p, then, necessarily p is actually true. What this means is that, of all the possibilities open to you at any given time, we can know with certainty that you will choose an option that is consistent with the future we will in fact have and with the past we have had. The past and future are unchangeable. But why confuse this with the obvious fact that the future is open? You could choose an option such that, were you to do so, the future would be different, though we know for certain -- we know infallibly, if you like -- that you won't. None of this entails that we have any power over the future or past, not even 'counterfactual power' (whatever that misleading phrase means). We have no power over things we, by hypothesis, cannot change or modify or affect in any way. But having an open future does not entail having power over it; it doesn't even entail that there are such things as powers.

Ramelow, in 'The God of Miracles', focuses on the possibility and evidence for miracles. (304) According to him, if God has the power to produce miracles, then God has the power to interrupt a law of nature. (304) It would have been nice to note that laws of nature are minimally exceptionless regularities, so 'interruptions' in the laws of nature are at most inter-world interruptions: something like God's actions in w being inconsistent with the laws of nature in w', where w is accessible from w'. Nothing in w -- not even God -- performs an action in w that is inconsistent with the laws of w.

Ramelow includes some discussion of Hume's argument against miracles, but surprisingly makes no mention of the best contemporary responses to Hume in John Earman's Hume's Abject Failure or David Johnson's Hume, Holism and Miracles. The omissions are unfortunate, given the importance of these works to the discussion and given his goals. Ramelow settles for some rather bold claims including:

if a miracle is the interruption of a natural determinism by a spiritual one, then it occurs in us all the time, and we know this even before we examine external evidence. In fact, the very act of examining evidence proves the point. Spinoza cannot be right. (311)

Ramelow asserts that, if there were no violations of causal law, then there would be no knowledge, reasoning, personal interacting or judging. These all involve 'transcending natural causality.' (311) Would that such astounding conclusions were so easy to come by! But there is absolutely no reason to think that advancing reasons in an argument entails acting in violation of the causal order. Many would find the suggestion that it does outrageously false.

Ramelow also includes discussion of the actuality of miracles, miracles in various religions, miracles and faith, and miracles and prior probabilities.

Virtually all of the papers in this collection come from a deeply Thomistic perspective. So, it's likely that the collection will be of interest especially to those committed to (or very sympathetic to) Thomistic metaphysics. But I should underscore that some of the papers -- in particular, those by Wainwright, Gerogiorgakis and Zagzebski -- will have a much broader audience among philosophers of religion.