God, Suffering, and the Value of Free Will

God Suffering And The Value Of Free Will

Laura W. Ekstrom, God, Suffering, and the Value of Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2021, 238pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197556412.

Reviewed by Kevin Timpe, Calvin University


Laura Ekstrom’s latest book provides extended engagement with the contemporary literature on the problems of evil. The book’s primary focus is to “show the extent and power of arguments from evil, while giving a thorough critical examination of attempts to answer them” (1). In this aim, she is successful. Unlike many atheists, Ekstrom thinks that the issues warrant a careful examination of the best case for theism. She has no truck with any kind of “steadfast commitment to God in isolation from reasoned debate” or with a “fervent conviction in the non-existence of God coupled with inattentiveness to careful philosophical responses on the part of reflective theists to arguments for atheism” (1). While I have different convictions than Ekstrom does and evaluate some of the arguments considered differently than she does, I’m appreciative of the seriousness with which she addresses the issues. There’s none of the contempt, scorn, or intellectual vices that too often characterize discussion of religious belief, not just by the general public but some philosophers too. Ekstrom thinks that if considerations of evil and suffering lead one to suspend or reject belief in God, there’s loss involved. This book illustrates many traits that I wish were more common in philosophy of religion, while also providing insightful engagement with a range of important issues. A number of the chapters are especially well done (e.g., chapters 5 and 6) even though they’re not as crucial to the central thrust of the book. Given this latter fact I won’t discuss them at length here despite their quality.

Chapter 1 lays out Ekstrom’s general approach to evil and the arguments to come. According to Ekstrom, arguments from evil should cause theists to “weaken their hold on theism” and her ideal theistic reader will “read this book as a call to further sustained philosophical attention to arguments from suffering and to the development of deepened, more persuasive replies to those arguments” (3). I agree with her that considerations of evil should decrease our degree of confidence in theistic beliefs.

Ekstrom seems to agree, or at least is willing to grant for the sake of her project, that the logical problem of evil fails, and that existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good God is compatible with the existence of evil. (Ekstrom makes it clear that the characterization of God that she’s working with in the book is “the traditional understanding of God as an absolutely perfect being who is essentially omnipotent, essentially omniscient, and essentially perfectly good” (190); this review follows suit.) Following the work of Peter van Inwagen, she grants that the existence of pointless evils, evils for which there is no God-justifying reason for causing or allowing those particular evils, is compatible with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good God: “It could be, and for all we know it is the case, that what was necessary for the greater good is that some evil or other like the instance of pointless evil occur . . . and this justification is sufficient for upholding the perfection of God” (18).

Much of Ekstrom’s book addresses what she calls the ‘Argument from Facts about Evil’:

  1. If God were to exist, then certain global facts about evil in our world would not obtain, including the vast amount of suffering, the intensity of suffering in truly horrid cases, and the unfair distribution of suffering.
  2. These facts about evil in our world do obtain, including the vast amount of suffering, in truly horrid cases, and the unfair distribution of suffering.
  3. Therefore, God does not exist. (19)

The first four chapters form a defense of the Argument from Facts about Evil (I come back to these below in more detail). Chapter 5 is an extended discussion of one particular type of evil, what David Lewis calls ‘a neglected argument’ from evil, that of suffering in hell, which she thinks strengthens the case for (1) even if it’s not strictly needed. (In terms of the book's structure, I think it would have made more sense for this chapter to come before what is currently chapter 4 on skeptical theism.)

Chapter 6 engages with Mark Murphy’s recent book God’s Own Ethics which provides a workaround that would defang the problem of evil. The final chapter, chapter 7, looks at whether one can justifiably have ‘religion on the cheap’, where that means having reasons to live a religious life as an agnostic or atheist, thereby getting the goods of religious practice (e.g., religious practices and a certain kind of oriented and orientating community, which she thinks are legitimate goods) without the cost of the metaphysical baggage. Ekstrom uses Howard Wettstein as an example of such an approach. Ekstrom argues that such a path isn’t sensible, indeed calling it a life that “exhibit[s] a kind of lack of integrity” (193) and is perhaps even “incoherent” (194). In light of the discussion of the Argument from Facts about Evil, we should instead simply accept the costs of jettisoning religious belief rather than embracing a kind of antirealism. These last two chapters are full of interesting arguments and insights, even if I’m not able to devote more attention to them here. Instead, in what follows I focus on the main thrust of the book, namely, Ekstrom’s treatment of the Argument from Facts about Evil.

Ekstrom differentiates two general kinds of response to the Argument from Facts about Evil. The first approach seeks to undermine the first premise by arguing that there are justifying reasons why the global facts about evils are compatible with God’s existence. The most frequently given reasons are punishment (dealt with briefly in section 1.3.1), character formation (section 1.3.2), free will, and intimacy with God. Each of these last two receives its own chapter (chapters 2 and 3 respectively). None of these theodicies should be expected,by itself, to explain all the evil referred to in the first premise of the Argument from Facts about Evil. But Ekstrom argues that even taken together they aren’t sufficient to undermine the argument.

A key value of Ekstrom’s book (as with some of her earlier work that the book draws on) is what she says about the value of free will:

I find the matter of the worth of free will . . . to be a serious and surprisingly under-appreciated problem in the literature on the problem of evil. In order for free will to serve as a backbone of a successful theodicy, the theodicist must support at least these two claims: (1) that we in fact have free will; and (2) that its value makes it worth the costs. (34)

Chapter 2 explores the value, both intrinsic and extrinsic, of free will in greater detail given the centrality of free will for theistic replies to arguments from evil. “The credibility of each of these theistic responses to the facts of evil turns on a judgement of the worth of free will” (37). Each of these responses requires that it’s reasonable for us to believe that free will is of ‘enormous value’ that would justify the sum of all the suffering that humans both cause and endure (37). Her central claim in this chapter, and in the volume as a whole, is that “the cost is simply too high. . . . Free will is not worth it” (38). She canvases a number of leading compatibilist accounts of free will (e.g., rational abilities views and hierarchical accounts) and thinks these kinds of freedom might indeed be valuable. She doesn’t think that they’ll help the theist respond to the challenge from evil, since having only these kinds of freedom wouldn’t require the ability to do evil. On compatibilism, we can get the goods that come from free will without having to endure the suffering that purportedly comes from it. The central concern then becomes “the matter of whether or not libertarian free will . . . is worth the cost” (48).

Even if free will as understood by the libertarian is intrinsically valuable, that itself doesn’t settle the question of whether that value outweighs the evil it makes possible. Ekstrom then devotes the rest of the chapter to goods that libertarian free will might make possible (e.g., certain kinds of love, moral responsibility, meaning, creativity), exploring whether or not those goods are ‘worth the cost’. In terms of justifying the evil in the world, she thinks that the value of libertarian freedom and the goods that it makes possible cannot withstand the weight of suffering: “what can one say except that libertarian free will seems just not worth it” (68). Others will, of course disagree; but her discussion here highlights just how important discussions of axiology are to these issues. Overall this chapter is an excellent addition, not only to discussions of the problem of evil, but also to debates about the nature and value of free will.

The theist then needs a response to the problem of evil that doesn’t rely so directly on the value of libertarian free will. In chapter 3, she considers another kind of good that potentially could justify evil:

A divine intimacy theodicy responds [to] the challenge of theism posed by the facts of evil by suggesting that some instances of suffering are avenues to knowledge of God. The central idea is that, sometimes when persons suffer, they experience closeness to God, either through an awareness of God’s presence with them or through identification with God. (73)

According to divine intimacy theodicies, then, the justification for much suffering comes not directly from the value of human freedom but the possibility of certain kinds of religious experiences that enable us to have valuable relationships with God. Shared experiences can deepen personal relationships, with others or with God. So perhaps God allows us to suffer in part to enable us to share in experience of God himself or (inclusive) to experience the loving presence of God.

Divine intimacy theodicies face a number of challenges, including the fact that it’s unclear that they can justify all instances of suffering. (It’s also not clear that they're ever intended to.) But perhaps the biggest challenge is what Ekstrom calls the ‘objection from cruelty’:

In order to make this proposal plausible [i.e. that relationship with God is achieved via suffering], the divine intimacy theodicist would need to defend the claim that the good thereby achieved—namely, the immense good of intimacy with a loving and suffering God—could not be achieved in any other (or better way). (86)

Either the suffering is the most effective, non-coercive means toward that end, or it makes possible a kind of knowledge that couldn’t be achieved in any other way. But whether or not the experience of suffering actually results in the aimed-at intimacy will depend again on free human response, and so the issue of the value of free will comes up again. Given that she thinks that only a libertarian understanding of free will can do the required heavy lifting, she again thinks that freedom isn’t worth the cost. It is especially not valuable enough to justify an eternity of suffering in hell (discussed at greater length in chapter 5). But even if it were, this divine intimacy response would “provide at most a very partial justificatory account” (91) of suffering. Similar considerations hold for attempts to justify suffering on the basis of deserved non-retributive punishment or character building.

Whereas the free will defense and the divine intimacy theodicy seek to reject premise (1) of the Argument from Facts about Evil, the second kind of approach argues that we are not justified in believing that the argument’s premises are true. Since free will is best positioned to explain what God-justifying reasons for suffering there might be and she’s found that explanation wanting, Ekstrom considers in chapter 4 that perhaps we simply don’t or can’t know what those reasons are. To go this route is to endorse a version of skeptical theism. Though details vary, the skeptical theist in general denies that evil gives us reason to justifiably believe that there are no God-justifying reasons for its existence and magnitude. She takes the following claim from Michael C. Rea to be the central expression of skeptical theism:

(ST) No human being is ever justified (or warranted, or reasonable) in thinking [i.e., believing] the following about any evil e that has ever occurred: there is (or is probably) no reason that could justify God in permitting e. (102)

Ekstrom thinks that (ST) is “simply implausible” (129). She argues that the intellectual humility at the core of a number of leading defenses of skeptical theism isn’t uniformly expressed; the reasons for humility in not expecting to know what reasons God, if God exists, might have for allowing evil should also encourage similar humility in terms of belief in such a being, especially in light of evil. This, I think, is true, and Ekstrom’s discussion in this chapter is a worthwhile addition to the literature on skeptical theism. It seems to me that for some people, the totality of their evidence will justify the belief that there is no God-justifying reason for some particular evil. In that case, (ST) will be false.

I think it’s best to understand Ekstrom’s Argument from Facts about Evil as a version of the evidential argument, particularly given her repeated examination of what it is reasonable for us to believe in the face of suffering. Evidence against a particular conclusion needs to be weighed against the evidence for it. This is where I think the theist’s best response to Ekstrom’s book lies. What she doesn’t engage, understandably so given the nature of the book, is the cumulative case for belief in God. Whatever reasons we have for believing in such a being, careful consideration of evil ought to lessen our overarching evaluation of the totality of the evidence (unless we endorse skeptical theism or Murphy’s God's Own Ethics). She does consider, in chapter 4, the possibility of a hybrid theodicy where different subclasses of evil are justified in different ways. She thinks this is an “exceedingly tall order” as “our experience of, and awareness of, facts about evil in the world provide awfully good reason to doubt that a hybrid case will succeed in covering the full range, distribution, and intensity of evils” (94f.). I think that going the hybrid route is probably the best bet for the theist, as there’s little antecedent reason to think that a single consideration will justify the entirety of the range of evil in the world. This aspect of the book is, I think, too quick. But on the whole, it’s an excellent book deserving of careful engagement given that it shows just how challenging the problem of evil is and what the stakes are concerning the value of freedom. Readers would do well to heed her call for further engagement with these issues.


Wettstein, Howard (2012). The Significance of Religious experience, New York: Oxford University Press.

Rea, Michael C. (2013). “Skeptical Theism and the ‘Too-Much-Skepticism’ Objection”. Justin P. McBrayer and Daniel Howard-Snyder (eds.). The Blackwell Companion to the Problem of Evil. Malden, MA: Wiley Blackwell.