God, the Best, and Evil

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Bruce Langtry, God, the Best, and Evil, Oxford University Press, 2008, 237pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199238798.

Reviewed by Richard M. Gale, University of Pittsburgh


This book is an exercise in apologetics that makes use of themes developed by the leading contemporary philosophers of religion, most notably, Plantinga, Swinburne, and Alston, to neutralize the challenge that evil poses for traditional theism. Its originality consists in the dazzling, rigorous manner in which these themes are deployed in elaborate deductive arguments. Only the stout of heart who are logically adept will be able to survive its onslaught of indented sentences and fine distinctions. This definitely is not a coffee table book!

The Introduction attempts to make clear just what sort of a God is in question. This is crucial since God comes in many different flavors, and the way in which his perfections are conceived can present theists with opportunities and/or limitations in neutralizing the challenge of evil. In this chapter Langtry develops concepts concerning God's goodness, omnipotence, omniscience, and providentiality that will play a key role in the arguments that are developed in subsequent chapters. After pointing out that we do not ordinarily use "God" according to exact rules he states that "for a great many purposes we will successfully explain what we are talking about by saying that (if God exists) God is the rational agent who brought the universe into existence and who is, either non-temporally or at all times, very powerful, very knowledgeable, and very good" (7; my italics). But two pages later he abandons this way of explaining what God is when he writes that "from now on, unless there is local indication to the contrary, sentences such as 'God exists' are to be understood as accompanied by a latent statement to the effect that God is the rational agent who brought the universe into existence and who is, either non-temporally or at all times, omnipotent, infallibly omniscient, and perfectly good; the word 'theism' will be used for the view that God exists and that the foregoing is true of him" (9).

What is the point of his initially saying that he will use "God" in a way that makes him only finitely perfect and then going back on this by declaring his intention to use "God" so that he has omni- rather than merely finite-perfections? Is he trying to confuse his reader or maybe he is being paid by the word? What I can understand is why he would not want to work with the conception of a finite God, the reason being that the finite conception would cause the Johnny Carson audience to chant in unison, "How finite is he?" It makes it too easy for theists to construct a theodicy, for no matter what horrendous evils are brought to their attention they can say, "He is very powerful, but just not that powerful!" One of the few flaws in Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion is that he does not have his henchman, Philo, challenge Cleanthes in this manner when he attempts to neutralize the problem of evil by making God's power finite.

Unfortunately, the manner in which Langtry understands God's omni-properties does not escape from the problem of making it too easy to give a theodicy. We are told that we should explain God's omnipotence in terms of his causal and cognitive powers (33). Omniscience is explained in terms of cognitive powers.

God is omniscient in world W if and only if God exists in W and for any proposition p which is true in W, in W it is the case that either God knows that p, or else he does not but his knowing that p is not precluded by any defect or limitation in his intrinsic cognitive capacities (39).

The problem is that Langtry's account of God's omnipotence and omniscience in terms of his intrinsic causal and cognitive capacities allows for a God who can do and know very little because he is not given suitable opportunities to exercise these capacities. Again, this makes the task of giving a theodicy too easy, since Langtry can say about any extant evil that God has the causal and cognitive powers to have prevented it but, unfortunately, did not have the opportunity to do so.

Langtry claims that his attempt to neutralize the challenge of evil "remains neutral between three leading positions with respect to divine providence: theological determinism, Molinism, and Open Theism" (9). Theological determinism holds that God "has strongly actualized the actual world by strongly actualizing every contingent state of affairs, except any contingent states of God himself that are metaphysically prior to all God's actions which strongly actualize states of affairs" (231). "A person strongly actualizes a state of affairs if and only if she causes it by performing an action which determines it" (231). Molinism is "the doctrine that libertarianism, comprehensive knowledge and comprehensive providence are all true" (230). Comprehensive knowledge requires that all actual states of affairs are infallibly known by God at every time at which he exists, and comprehensive providence has everything that occurs be either intended by God or an unintended consequence of what he intends (238). Open Theism holds libertarianism and denies that God has either comprehensive knowledge or comprehensive providence (230).

Unfortunately, Langtry's account of Molinism is deeply flawed. It saves human freedom by having God only weakly actualizing the free actions of creatures. There are free will subjunctive conditions, having contingent truth-values independently of God's will, that predict what free actions would be performed if God were to strongly actualize their antecedent by creating persons who are free with respect to some action. Langtry gives this definition of "weakly actualize":

A person weakly actualizes non-conjunctive state of affairs x if and only if neither she nor anything else actualizes x and yet she performs some single action that makes a salient causal contribution to x's occurrence and is such that if she were to perform it then x would obtain (231; my italics).

But this has the unwanted consequence that when God creates a person and makes her free with respect to an action x, he does not weakly actualize her doing x, since, obviously, she actualizes action x by intentionally performing it.

Langtry gives the Plantinga-type account of how God weakly actualizes the free actions of creatures, namely by strongly actualizing both their existence and their being free with respect to various actions with full knowledge of what they will freely do because he knows the contingent truth-values of the relevant free will subjunctive conditional propositions that predict what free actions would be performed if God were to strongly actualize both their existence and their being free with respect to various actions. But he fails to consider a powerful objection to this account that is found in the literature, but modesty forbids me to tell you the name of the great genius that gave it. Because God creates free persons with prior knowledge of what actions they will freely perform, he causes their actions. And this is true of all of their actions. But this seems to give God a freedom-canceling control over them and thus their actions are not free. And thus the buck of moral blame for their untoward actions cannot stop with them but must reach through them to God.

Armed with these distinctions Langtry sets out on his apologetic voyage. Unfortunately Langtry's arguments are too lengthy and complex to admit of a summary in this review, and thus I owe him an apology for failing to do justice to their depth and subtlety, which is the major contribution his book makes to the extant literature. But given the flaws in the concepts that he feeds into his deductive argument mill what comes out will be flawed. A sausage making machine cannot produce good sausages, no matter how well it works, unless the right ingredients are fed into it.

Chapters 2, 3, and 4 are concerned with what can be expected of God with respect to what possible world he will choose to actualize. A world is prime if God can actualize it, and he cannot actualize a world better than it. The following conclusions are reached after extensive argument: if there is at least one prime world, then if God does create some world he will create a prime world; if there is an infinite regress of worlds with respect to goodness, God will engage in satisficing, to use Herb Simon's concept, by creating one that is good enough, despite the fact that he could create a world which is better, and this does not give rise to a good objection to theism, in spite of the fact that for any world he could have actualized he could have actualized an even better one; even if there is a best world, or several equal-best worlds, God might not be able actualize any of them.

In chapters 5-8 Langtry develops a partial theodicy, which is neutral between Theological Compatibilism and libertarianism, of the soul building variety that appeals to goods bound up with human free will, moral responsibility, and the roles of individuals' own personal traits in shaping their own and other people's lives. He presents this case in an eloquent and moving manner that owes much to Swinburne but which avoids the perverse extremes to which Swinburne pushes it when he claims that slavery, the Holocaust, and the desire to rape and murder little girls are good because they increase our opportunities to exercise significant free will. Admittedly, there are evils that are not covered by this theodicy, and, for them, Langtry appeals to theistic skepticism of the Book of Job variety. "We are entitled to believe … that it is not improbable that there are no truths … that … would provide God … with defeaters for his strong prima facie reasons for ensuring that there was no intense human or animal suffering" (205). "It would not be all that surprising if there were reasons actually providing an unknown justification for God to permit horrific suffering" (226). This is much too quick and glib for it fails to address the strong biblically-based case that can be made out that God would want to clue us in on the reasons why he causes or permits horrendous suffering, the Fall being a very good case in point in which he made it known what his reason is for inflicting great evils on our distant ancestors.

There are serious flaws in many of Langtry's arguments but space limitations preclude my discussing them. I will give just one example. According to an Open Theist, such as William Hasker,

(1) It is necessary that (if Jones freely does A at time t7, then God does not know prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7).

In conjunction with

(2) In the actual world Jones freely does A at time t7,

it follows that

(3) God does not know in the actual world prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7.

It would follow that it is necessary that God does not know in the actual world prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7 only if the necessity operator in (1) were placed before its consequent, but this would be a blatant de re/de dicto confusion. Langtry then points out that "it is logically possible that both [Jones does A at t7 ] and God foreknows this truth, because it is only contingently the case that when [Jones does A he will do A freely]. Hence given that (2) is true, Hasker will have to admit that God does not infallibly foreknow every truth that logically can be infallibly foreknow" (38; for the sake of brevity I have changed Langtry's example).

To be sure it is logically possible that God foreknows that Jones does A at t7; but, if God were to know this in the actual world a contradiction would follow, as is brought out by the following conditional proof.

(4) God foreknows in the actual world that Jones does A at t7. (assumption for conditional proof)

(5) God knows in the actual world that Jones is free with respect to doing or refraining from doing A at t7 and thus knows that if Jones does A at t7 Jones does A freely at t7.

(6) God knows in the actual world that Jones freely does A at t7. (from (4) and (5))

(3) God does not know in the actual world prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7.

(7) God does not know in the actual world prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7 and God does know in the actual world prior to t7 that Jones freely does A at t7. (from (3) and (4))

(8) It is not the case that God foreknows in the actual world that Jones does A at t7. (from (4)-(7) by conditional proof).

In possible worlds in which God foreknows that Jones does A at t7 Jones does not freely do A at t7.