Good God: The Theistic Foundations of Morality

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David Baggett and Jerry L. Walls, Good God: The Theistic Foundations of Morality, Oxford University Press, 2011, 283pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199751815.

Reviewed by John Hare, Yale University


This is, on the whole, a very good book. It gathers together arguments for an ambitious thesis, that 'morality ultimately needs God to make full rational sense.' I myself agree with this thesis, and so I am sympathetic to their project.

I will proceed by mentioning four hesitations I have about the project of the book, and then by describing its chief merits. One hesitation I have is that the two authors have not been consistent in the audience to whom the book is addressed. They say they have aimed at an audience wider than scholars and academics, including those who have no background in philosophy. This is an admirable goal, but they have not in fact been able to carry it out consistently. Philosophical terms and symbols are introduced without definition, and the argument fairly frequently reaches a high level of complexity. I think these are often the best bits of the book, and I wish they had not felt the need to 'dumb down' the rest of it. For example, the first appendix is an elegant argument against Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Louise Antony that a theist who wants to defend a divine command theory should not agree that if God were to command the torture of infants that would be morally obligatory. In conjunction with a recent defense of the same point by Alexander Pruss, they make a strong case. But their argument requires venturing into the semantics of counterfactuals, and there is no way that someone without philosophical background is going to be able to follow them.

Their reason for wanting to appeal to a broader audience is that they want to enter into the 'struggle for men's souls' that E. O. Wilson predicted would be central to the twenty-first century. But the cost of this decision is that they often make shorter work of their opponents than their opponents deserve. Baggett and Walls no doubt have made the judgment that going into all the qualifications and nuances that would be required in a book directed to philosophical professionals or students with some philosophical background would alienate their intended audience. But the effect is that their arguments are sometimes uncomfortably loose. I will give just one example. Baggett and Walls argue that naturalists have a hard time justifying the sense of moral outrage that we feel at the Holocaust or horrendous natural disasters like tsunamis, in which hundreds of thousands suffer or die. But they argue this on the basis that naturalists treat morality as it has traditionally been understood as an illusion (e.g., p. 223). They cite Michael Ruse, who certainly does think this. But there are many naturalists who do not; Peter Singer for example (whom they cite elsewhere) does not. Such thinkers try to provide naturalistic justifications, or they argue that morality is axiomatic and does not need justification. Baggett and Walls are, I think, perfectly aware of this, but in the interests of snappy exposition, they leave out these qualifications. But the net result is to leave the even-moderately informed reader with a sense that the argument has not been fairly presented.

The second main hesitation I have is about their hostile treatment of Calvinism. The book would have been better off without this chapter. I say this not because I disagree with the chapter (though I do), but because it does not contribute to the project of the book as a whole. The authors seem to have this bee in their bonnet, and they clearly feel passionately about it. The language in this chapter is often sarcastic and bitter, for example the final paragraph:

So the problems with Calvinism stack up: Compatibilism, Euphemism, Radical voluntarism, the Terrible tenet (unconditional election), and a Semantic issue (equivocation on the meaning of 'love'), which form the acrostic CERTS -- only these are bound to leave a bad taste in your mouth. [We are supposed to compare TULIP.] (p. 81)

The authors do not tell us that predestination/ reprobation and compatibilism about human freedom and divine sovereignty were the position of Aquinas just as much as Calvin. They do not discuss either the biblical texts that lie behind the Calvinist view or the motivation that also lies behind it, to be faithful to the experience of being in God's hands, even in one's choices for God. If they had wanted merely to defuse the objection that the doctrine of unconditional election is inconsistent with the goodness of God, they could have put their point hypothetically. They could have said that Christians are divided on the issue of how to understand the relation of God's love to predestination, and if you think x, you will accept version A of this relation, and if you think y, you will accept version B. This would have had the advantage of not alienating those Thomist and Calvinist readers who do accept a compatibilist view of human freedom and divine sovereignty.

This hesitation connects with a third. Baggett and Walls take as their opponents naturalists on the one side and radical voluntarists, or 'Ockhamists,' on the other. But they have not understood Ockham properly. Their reading of him is, indeed, not unique to them. It is shared by the present pope, as they mention. But they should read the magisterial two-volume work of Marilyn Adams on Ockham, and even more, the work of Lucan Freppert, which she largely endorses. The present review is not the proper place to launch into an account of Ockham. I will say, simply, that I think his view is that the command to not love God, though its content is possible in itself, is pragmatically incoherent (a practical contradiction) because it cannot be disobeyed; this is because to disobey it is already to love God: 'The created will cannot elicit such an act during this time.' (Quodlibetal Questions III.14) A content can be non-contradictory in itself but contradictory as commanded. This seems to be the view of the preponderance of Ockham's texts on the issue, in which he teaches that to obey God and to love God are the same thing. A content can also be non-contradictory as commanded, but contradictory as commanded by God.

One final hesitation is about what Baggett and Walls say about the need for goodness, even the goodness of God, to be something recognizable. This theme is one they take to distinguish themselves from 'radical voluntarists' or 'Ockhamists.' My hesitation about their position here is also a hesitation about a similar position taken by Robert M. Adams in Finite and Infinite Goods. Baggett and Walls think there is a set of 'convictions of the deepest ingression' (p. 135) that are truly nonnegotiable, and we cannot properly take anything to be a command of God that violates these convictions. My worry is that this is not consistent with a position they also want to advance, that our perceptions are deeply flawed by sin. A Christian needs to acknowledge that 'What is highly valued among men is detestable in God's sight.' (Luke 16:15). Jesus does not mean that everything highly valued by humans is detested by God, but his warning to the Pharisees, 'who loved money,' is that we have to worry about an inference from universal human attachment to divine endorsement. We have to worry about any attempt to make Jesus's gospel less than revolutionary, or less than counter to 'common sense.' Christian philosophers who write about this topic need to read more Barth. I am not saying that we are left with an impasse. But there is a rich theological tradition of discussion here that needs to be acknowledged and is not in this book. The fact that we can 'tell a story' to justify ascribing some command to God does not seem sufficient to allow us to take it to be God's (though it does seem necessary). Baggett and Walls propose this test: 'We should ask if we can identify a possibly true proposition consistent with God's moral perfection rationally construed, that would potentially entail such a command' (p. 136). I am not sure how to construe 'potentially entail,' but consider the airline-hijackers of 9/11. Sin affects not just our desires but our rationalizations and theological meta-narratives.

Having said all of this by way of criticism, I want to end by reaffirming that the book is, on the whole, a very good book. I do not want to give a predominantly negative impression. Making points of disagreement is usually more helpful and more interesting than simply agreeing. Nonetheless, the book does an excellent job of supporting the moral argument for belief in God, an argument that has been unjustly neglected in favor of other parts of natural theology, such as the arguments from the origin of the universe or fine-tuning. Especially valuable are chapters 5 ('God and Goodness'), 7 ('Abhorrent Commands'), 8 ('The Problem of Evil'), and appendix A ('Answering the Extended Arbitrariness Objection to Divine Command Theory'). A reader who knows the book will, I think, share my view that these are the places where there is the largest number of original arguments, contributing new thoughts to the field. I hope that the authors will consider writing another book, directed deliberately at those who do have some philosophical background and building on the insights in these places. From these four chapters I would highlight first the distinction between dependence and control. Moral truths can be necessary and still depend on God. They will not have 'aseity.' But this does not mean that these necessary truths are 'within God's control.' Baggett and Walls tie this combination in an illuminating way to Alvin Plantinga's thoughts about non-moral necessary truths and their relation to God. They also argue convincingly that William Lane Craig's view that atheism leads to moral nihilism is unlikely to be persuasive.

Secondly, in chapter 7, it is good to recognize that we need to draw a line somehow between what are sensible contenders to be divine commands and what are not. It is good also to connect this line to our theological narrative. As I said earlier, I do not think the line they actually draw is sufficient. But their suggestion carries forward the conversation about this very difficult matter. Thirdly, in chapter 8, the controversy with Bruce Russell about the problem of evil reaches some new ground, in particular their reply to the two different analogies Russell proposes, first the analogy between a Wykstra-type CORNEA reply and the reply by someone who thinks God created the earth a hundred years ago that God has reasons for deceiving us, and second the analogy that God should intervene more often to prevent suffering, even if not always, just as a good human parent intervenes when one child threatens another with a hammer. Finally, the first appendix provides a strong response to the claim that a divine command theorist is committed to the view that if God were (counterpossibly) to command the torture of infants, this would then be morally obligatory.

In these four places, and in others, Baggett and Walls take the best current arguments in the field and take them forwards. It is remarkable how much they are able to do along these lines within the constraints of non-professional readability they have set for themselves. As I said at the beginning of this review, I think they sometimes stray beyond these constraints. The book is excellent evidence that if they were to cast these constraints aside, they would be capable of work that carries the professional conversation forward on a very impressive scale.