Goodbye, Kant!: What Still Stands of the Critique of Pure Reason

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Maurizio Ferraris, Goodbye, Kant!: What Still Stands of the Critique of Pure Reason, Richard Davies (tr.), SUNY Press, 2013, 136pp., $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438448084.

Reviewed by Riccardo Pozzo, National Research Council of Italy


This short book provides an accessible account of a very difficult one, the Critique of Pure Reason, by far the most influential of Kant's works, for it was the first of the three Critiques and made most fully explicit the Copernican revolution, which is the main subject of Ferraris's book. After a first chapter on Kant's revolution of eighteenth-century metaphysics, Ferraris isolates Kant's most fundamental claims in chapter two, and then, in chapter three, he shows what Kant inherits from tradition, in chapter four, what he invents, and in chapter five what goes wrong. Chapters six to eight set out the fundamental claims in detail, without comparing them with alternative theories, but taking literally Kant's idea that there are principles which hold good not just for science, but also for experience. Chapter nine seeks to dismantle the sophisticated mechanism that stands behind the doctrines, and chapter ten presents Kant's evolution after the first Critique. Finally, chapter eleven aims at a reckoning with the revolution, its immediate effects and its legacy, its merits, and its martyrs. In some of the chapters, Ferraris limits himself to pursuing Kant's line of thought; in others he includes systematic reflections and historical observations. To alert the reader, the titles of  these chapters describe each as an "Examinations."

For Ferraris, given that "ontology includes everything that is in heaven and earth, the realm of objects that are available to experience," which makes up the first main topic of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, and given that "metaphysics deals with what goes beyond or transcends [experience]," which makes up the second main topic of the book, it does indeed make sense to speak of Kant's metaphysics and ontology (p. 20). In fact, "the reader of the Analytic has before him Kant's ontology, a work of construction and not of destruction" (p. 21). Ferraris follows suit with the two otherwise opposed readings of Kant by Strawson and Heidegger, with Strawson calling for a metaphysics of experience and Heidegger for an analysis of finite human being, "which amounts" -- Ferraris succinctly notes -- "to the same thing, said with more passion" (p. 21).

Ferraris sees in Kant's first Critique -- a work of both ontology and metaphysics -- the naturalization of physics at its outset. In virtue of the Copernican revolution, Kant is describing both the human mind and the necessary pure structures of humans and perhaps other beings suitably similar to them: "mind and world are two sides of the same coin" (p. 27). Today, the naturalization of physics implies a basic level of ontology and a higher level of epistemology. From this standpoint, it is easy to make out Kant's confusion between the two levels, which provides amusing arguments in chapters 6 to 8, in which Ferraris takes on Kant's proposals regarding conceptual schemes, phenomena, space, time, the "I," substance, and cause, with a view to seeing whether they really suffice to explain our experience (p. 47). The answer is no.. We may wish Kant "Good-bye," suggests Ferraris -- and come back to where it all came from, namely from realism, from Aristotle, let me add. Ferraris proposes that we might eventually want to ask why Kant had to appeal to physics to set in motion the "clumsy mechanism" of the deduction. The answer again is "because physics presented the only response then available to the skeptical consequence of empiricism. If he had had, for instance, Darwinian theory at his disposal, then it would have been enough to say that we are as we are because we evolved in world that is as it is" (p. 91). Although a response like this might seem Panglossian in implicitly supposing that our world is the best of all possible, "there would have been no need for a transcendental deduction," for "some reference to motor skills and bodily schemes would have done the trick" (p. 91), which would have called back into play realism in place of transcendentalism.

As regards the outstanding problem of the role played by ontology in the first Critique, Ferraris notes that from the vantage point of the Copernican revolution everything is real, but is so within our conceptual schemes and relative to our perceptive apparatus. Although Kant would have never admitted it, this means that, even if we were brains in a vat of organic liquid stimulated electrically by a mad scientist (as happens in the 1999 movie Matrix), the objectivity of our knowledge would not have been altered one jot. Kant calls this empirical realism, which in his view does not exclude the transcendental idealism that says that everything depends on our conceptual schemes. At first glance, "Kant's world is the world of Matrix: nothing really real; everything is just appearance that strikes our senses. And this is indeed how Kant was understood by many of his contemporaries and successors." One can think the Copernican revolution is about changing colored glasses -- sometimes the world looks red and sometimes blue. The issue, however, is rather more sensible and sophisticated:

The world is out there independently of what we perceive, think, and know of it. We humans see it in one way that is the same for everybody, while other beings see it in a different way, or perhaps do not see it at all. However, no one creates the world or invents it: In other words, our world is the same as a bat's, except that we see things while bats echolocate them." (p. 98)

Ferraris concedes that Kant was indeed successful against common sense, against a naive view of things, against an immediate relation with the world, which he did not attain with the inconclusiveness of a skeptic, but with the constructive desire "of an honest philosopher . . . one of the few men to whom this description can be applied without irony" (p. 103). One must acknowledge though, continues Ferraris, that the path that Kant pointed out "has often turned out to be a shortcut, but it was also the only one that metaphysics could take to get out of the slough in which it found itself" (p. 103).

The return of realism two hundred years after the Copernican revolution is not to be seen, then, as the "tedious result of pendulum swing" (p. 103). It is instead the proof that Kant's turn has been fully assimilated: "A naive view of the world is possible and even necessary, but the naiveté is not given and must be earned" (p. 103). Reason can give itself as much work as it likes: "the objects remain there, as impassive and solid as trees and houses, even when they are laws and norms, and even when they are that rather queer sort of object that is a subject" (p. 105).

This is a short book that provides food for thought for both experts and students. A bestseller in Italy, Goodbye, Kant! delivers a nontechnical, entertaining, full of Calvinian levity, and occasionally irreverent overview of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, with some side-glances to the Critique of Practical Reason and to the Critique of Judgment. Let me note, finally, that Ferraris has borrowed his title from a 2003 movie, Goodbye, Lenin!, which depicts both relief at the passing of the Soviet era and affection for the ideals it embodied. To be quite frank, Ferraris considers Kant's philosophy as perfectly useless today. He makes it clear that Kant's claims, relative to what science and philosophy have come to regard as the conditions of knowledge and experience, ought to be subject to lighthearted and fearless evaluation. Ferraris amuses himself and the reader while looking for limits and blind spots. The refrain is: time is ripe for a reconsideration of realism; idealism is passé. For Kantianism is no longer just a school of thought: "it is an entire style of thinking whose effects spread far beyond its direct influences" (p. 97).