Goodness and Justice: A Consequentialist Moral Theory

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Joseph Mendola, Goodness and Justice: A Consequentialist Moral Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 326pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521859530.

Reviewed by Elinor Mason, University of Edinburgh


Joseph Mendola's new book is very ambitious. He aims to defend an original version of consequentialist hedonism, both normatively (he tries to show that the theory is internally consistent and intuitively plausible) and meta-ethically (he tries to show that the theory is actually true).

He starts by defending his 'Multiple-Act consequentialism' ('MAC'). The kernel of the view is that consequentialist evaluation should focus on group actions. The first question to raise then, is whether there are such things as group actions. Mendola argues that there are. He draws on work by Margaret Gilbert, who argues that two people are involved in a joint action when they each have an obligation to the other to continue with the action. Mendola agrees with the substance of this, but wants to say that group actions do not depend on prior obligations; for Mendola it will be the other way around: group actions exist, and we may or may not have obligations to join in on them. So Mendola adapts Gilbert's account: "What seems crucial is not the fact of … a[n] obligation, but rather merely the mutual acceptance that there is such an obligation" (p. 35). That seems to be an acceptable if inelegant account of something we might call 'group actions'. But of course the real question is, why should consequentialist evaluation focus on such group actions?

As Mendola stresses, the problem with 'indirect' forms of consequentialism is that they lack a consequentialist rationale -- it seems odd to follow an indirect strategy (such as cultivating a disposition, or following a rule) if, overall, more good would result from defecting. According to Mendola, MAC is a form of direct consequentialism. This is because, on Mendola's view, the relevant agents are group agents. According to Mendola there are various overlapping agents -- from 'atomic agents' (momentary time slices of individual human agents), through what we might think of as the usual conception of an agent (namely, a person over time), to group agents (which can be families, friendships, corporations, universities and so on). In fact, our usual conception of an agent as a person over time turns out to be a group agent on Mendola's view -- it is a group consisting of all the temporally distinct atomic agents. This account of agency is novel and interesting, and it is suggestive of an interesting strategy for dealing with the responsibility of groups. However, it seems to me that there is one major issue that Mendola does not address. While I (where 'I' refers to the atomic agent typing these words right now) am part of various groups in Mendola's sense, I can opt out of some and not out of others. I can defect from the family, the department, the university, but I cannot defect from the group agent that consists of the group of temporally distinct atomic Elinors. Surely this is relevant to how I ought to evaluate my options? In other words, there seems to be some justification for the usual conception of agency over the other possible conceptions Mendola discusses.

Mendola, however, does not consider claims of priority for the usual conception of agency -- for him, all the agents in a situation are equally 'real'. So Mendola points out, correctly, that if we apply direct consequentialist evaluation to the options of all these agents we shall come up with conflicts, and we need a principled way to resolve those conflicts. He says:

The cases in which an atomic agent should defect from beneficent group acts and the cases in which it should not defect ought to reflect in some way the relative normative weight of the independent atomic agent and project, on the one hand, and the group agent and project on the other. (p. 45)

Of course it is difficult to know how to compare the acts -- what should be held fixed and what should be varied? Mendola decides that:

we should compare a first situation in which the atomic agent achieves what it can by defection but in which the various other atomic agents that in fact constitute the group agent do not constitute such an agent, to a second situation in which the group agent acts as it does, and the atomic agent does not defect … [O]ne should defect from a group act with good consequences only if one can achieve better consequences by the defecting act alone than the entire group act achieves. (p. 46, Mendola's italics)

There is something very peculiar about this conclusion. The problem is that intuitively, direct consequentialist evaluation should be applied to possible outcomes, and in this case, clearly the possible outcomes are, first, I defect and the group act goes on without me, or second, I do not defect and only the group act gets done. The first outcome, where I defect and do some extra good, is obviously better than the second outcome. Yet Mendola's supposedly direct theory tells us to choose the second outcome -- what has happened here? Mendola reminds us that individual acts over time are group acts in his sense, and points out that no-one would think that we should apply direct consequentialist evaluation to the temporal parts of an action, since they might be disastrous in isolation; this of course is Castañeda's paradox of act consequentialism. However, this is not an argument for treating all parts and wholes of actions equally and comparing them to each other in isolation. Rather it is an argument for finding a rationale for focussing on only one conception of action/agency. Castaneda's paradox illuminates the interesting fact that we really do think that we ought to judge the whole act and not its parts -- and we need an argument to justify this. I have hinted at one such argument, and there are others in the literature.

Mendola's meta-ethical argument is based on the claim that pleasure and pain are inherently normative. The argument is complex and proceeds via a discussion of the tension between constitutive naturalism and two dimensionalism. For simplicity I will leave that aside here, and concentrate on the core of the argument -- Mendola's claims about the nature of pain. Mendola asks us to imagine a murder, and to set aside the question of whether or not the murder, all things considered, was 'for the best'. Mendola asks, "Is there anything in what happened to the [victim] that cannot be adequately and completely described without admitting its disvalue?" (p. 154). Mendola argues that there is. That seems like a tall order. Surely the thoroughgoing naturalist will immediately answer, no -- there is nothing that we cannot describe fully; the victim feels pain and dies, end of story.

Mendola argues that a complete description of the situation must involve the phenomenal properties -- i.e. a description of how it feels to the victim -- and crucially, it feels painful to the victim. So far, so familiar. Mendola takes this a step further though, saying:

Painfulness … is a kind of disvalue. The phenomenal difference between those in bliss and those in agony includes a difference in a sort of felt phenomenal value. The phenomenal difference between pain and pleasure seems (at least in part and sometimes) to be that the phenomenal component of the former is nastier, intrinsically worse than that of the second. (p. 157)

If Mendola could convince us that this was true it would be a brilliant move, but as it stands it is hard to see how it does not beg the question. If by 'disvalue' he means painfulness, then of course the claim is true (but trivial) -- pain is painful. If 'disvalue' means objective badness, it must mean more than that the agent does not value it, and then of course it is very hard to see how the argument could work. Mendola relies on an intuitive conflation of the self-evident (but hard to pin down) 'nastiness' of pain and the disvalue of pain. Intuitively there is definitely something there, but Mendola wants more than that -- he wants a meta-ethical proof that hedonism is true. This is perhaps where this admirably ambitious book is over ambitious. If the meta-ethical section is to be more than merely suggestive it would need a whole book on its own.